Mindreading: an integrated account of pretence, self-awareness, and understanding of other minds

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Nichols, Shaun and Stich, Stephen, Mindreading: an integrated account of pretence, self-awareness, and understanding of other minds, Oxford University Press, 2003, 237 pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 0198236107.

Reviewed by Peter Carruthers, University of Maryland


This book is Nichols and Stich’s long-awaited monograph on the ’theory of mind’ debate. The wait has been well worth it. Their discussion is integrative, innovative, extremely well informed, and crystal clear. Moreover, their own theories are for the most part carefully thought through and have been worked out in far greater detail than those of their competitors. This book sets a new benchmark for quality in discussions of human mind-reading abilities, and deserves to be highly influential in the field.

Following a short introduction, the core of the book consists of three lengthy chapters devoted to developing and defending the authors’ theories of the cognitive mechanisms underlying, respectively, (a) pretence, (b) the attribution of mental states to other people, and (c) the attribution of mental states to oneself. The book then concludes with a shortish final chapter responding to some objections to their views, and considering the philosophical implications of the position they have reached. The overall goal of the book is to develop detailed and defensible ’boxologies’ for the three abilities in question (breaking them down into sub-systems and specifying the modes of interaction amongst those sub-systems), which are both consistent with the available psychological data and can serve as a springboard for further scientific investigation. I shall say something about the contents of each of the three major chapters, before turning to outline some significant criticisms of the third. (The chapter on self-awareness is by far the weakest in the book, in my view.)

It is a remarkable fact about human beings – and one that appears to be distinctive of our species – that human children at about the age of eighteen months begin to engage in pretend play. They pretend to be firemen or nurses, mothers bathing a baby, or fathers traveling to work on a bus. They hold pretend tea parties, and pretend to cook and eat mud pies. They hold conversations with imaginary friends. And so on. Children continue to pretend as they grow up, and retain both the ability and the behavior into adulthood. Adults will engage in games of pretence with children, of course, but will also engage in pretence with other adults, as a number of the experiments conducted with college students by Nichols and Stich can attest.

The goal of the long second chapter of the book is to develop a cognitive theory of pretence, contrasting it with the competitors (notably the on-line simulation account proposed by Robert Gordon and the meta-representational account put forward by Alan Leslie) and showing how it can explain a wide range of data (both experimental and common-sense).

At the heart of the model is a ’Possible Worlds Box’, which is a special-purpose workspace of the mind designed to take an initial supposition or hypothetical idea as input and to build an elaborate scenario around it. These elaborations occur partly through the use of the same inferential mechanisms that operate on beliefs to produce new beliefs, and partly through the construction of supplementary suppositions (as when a child having a pretend tea party with her teddy bear then pretends that they have just been joined by another visitor – ’And now here comes donkey to join us’). In addition, the same updating mechanisms that are used to eradicate beliefs that are inconsistent with a newly acquired belief are co-opted by the Possible Worlds Box to ensure that only beliefs consistent with the initial supposition(s) are deployed in the elaboration.

Nichols and Stich speculate that the Possible Worlds Box evolved for hypothetical and counter-factual reasoning quite generally, deployed both in planning and in figuring out the likely consequences of events in the world, and that it was then exapted for use in pretence. They suggest that the motivation to engage in pretence is provided by an innate desire to behave in ways similar to the way some character or object behaves in the possible world whose description is currently in the Possible Worlds Box. (While I have my doubts about this last proposal, I shall suppress them here for reasons of space.)

The Possible Worlds Box is said to stand on the same footing with the Belief Box and the Desire Box; so the idea is, in effect, that we need to recognize a distinctive propositional attitude of supposing alongside believing and desiring. This isn’t a new idea, but it is worked out and defended here in considerable detail. And the overall result is for the most part very plausible indeed.

The lengthy third chapter, on the mechanisms underlying our capacities both to attribute mental states to other people and to interpret and predict their behavior, forms the core of the book. It is an outstanding achievement. The model is an eclectic one, involving both simulation-like components and information-rich components (both theory-like and modular). There are various postulated mechanisms for detecting the perceptual states of other people, for detecting the desires of other people, and for detecting the beliefs of other people where they differ from one’s own. The Possible Worlds Box is utilized to construct a representation of the world as seen by the other, and then the subject’s own inferential mechanisms and planning mechanisms are utilized to figure out what else the target might believe, or to work out what he might do. And the whole process is orchestrated by a system called the ’Mind-reading coordinator’, which manages the interactions of the various different components. While most of the basic components are held to be innate, there remains, on the authors’ account, much work left for learning to do in the course of development.

Nichols and Stich show how their model explains a wide range of data – common sense, developmental, experimental, and pathological. And they demonstrate how their model does a significantly better job of explaining the full range of data than do any of the opposition theories – including the exclusively theory-based accounts of Alison Gopnik and Henry Wellman, the exclusively-modular accounts of Alan Leslie and others, the exclusively simulation-based accounts of Robert Gordon and Alvin Goldman, as well as the rationality-based ’Intentional Stance’ theory of Daniel Dennett. Once again, the overall result is very plausible indeed. Nichols and Stich’s model deserves instantly to become the main focus of theoretical and experimental attention for all those people who are interested in understanding our species’ remarkable capacity for reading each other’s minds.

In their penultimate chapter the authors turn to an account of self-awareness. They defend the view that there are two (or more) distinct self-monitoring mechanisms, one (at least) for monitoring and providing self-knowledge of our own experiential states, and one for monitoring and providing self-knowledge of our own propositional attitudes. These mechanisms are held to be distinct from one another, and also from the mind-reading system that deals with the mental states of other people. As previously, they examine a variety of kinds of data and present a number of considerations in support of their model, and in criticism of what they take to be the main opposition, namely, the ’theory-theory’ view that our knowledge of our own mental states is not significantly different in kind from our knowledge of other people’s. But where the previous chapters had been grounded in a rich and well-established body of experimental data, the chapter on self-awareness places considerable reliance on just a few unreplicated experimental studies. This is unfortunate, although there is, nevertheless, much that is of value in the ensuing discussion.

If it unfortunate, too, that a monolithic theory-theory isn’t actually their only or most plausible opponent. A number of us have defended a hybrid view, according to which our knowledge of our own experiences is semi-immediate and recognitional, whereas our knowledge of our own propositional attitudes is theoretical. And the first part of this view is one to which Nichols and Stich themselves should have been led, since the existence of a separate perception-monitoring mechanism is wholly unnecessary, even on their own account.

To see this, one just has to notice that the overall mind-reading faculty (as described in their previous chapter) must be capable of receiving perceptual inputs. More specifically, the perception-detection mechanism must receive such inputs. It will need to receive a percept representing the relations that obtain between the target subject and its environment, for example, on which it will need to effect various computations (e.g. tracking the subject’s line of sight) to figure out what the subject is perceiving. (One way of developing this idea would be to adopt some variant of Bernard Baars’ ’global broadcasting’ model, according to which perceptual states – when conscious – are globally broadcast to a whole suite of consumer systems for drawing inferences, for forming beliefs, for forming memories, for planning, and so on. And included amongst these consumer systems for perceptual states would be the mind-reading faculty (or some of its ’front end’ elements.) But then if the perception-detecting mechanism is already receiving the subject’s own perceptual states as input, it will be trivially easy for it to self-ascribe experiences. The existence of a separate perception-self-monitoring mechanism is wholly unnecessary.

Notice, however, that in one sense the detection of one’s own experiential (and imagistic) states will be ’theoretical’, on this alternative account, since it will involve the very same information-rich mechanism as is involved in the attribution of such states to other people; but the process of detection will be trivial, requiring only the classification of the perceptual inputs to the system as such. (Some of us who have written on this topic have talked, in this connection, about recognitional applications of theoretically embedded concepts.) What we would have here is an information-rich mechanism for ascribing mental states to other people, that is also capable of self-ascribing experiences on the basis of the perceptual states that are available to it as input.

When it comes to self-ascribing propositional attitudes, on this alternative account (which assumes that there is no self-monitoring mechanism separate from the mind-reading faculty, remember), notice that the evidence available to that faculty will include both visual imagery and ’inner speech’. For since the evidence suggests that these phenomena utilize the very same mechanisms as do vision and speech-perception respectively, then they, too, should be available as inputs to the mind-reading faculty. This then provides us with the materials with which to flesh-out what Nichols and Stich describe as the ’mystery version’ of the theory-theory account of self-awareness (viz.: there is a special source of information exploited in reading one’s own mind in addition to one’s own behavior); and it also serves to undermine a great many of their arguments in support of the propositional self-monitoring mechanism.

For example, on such a view it should come as no surprise that high-functioning autistic subjects are able to solve certain meta-memory tasks, describing how they set about remembering a sequence of numbers. For memory tasks of this sort routinely involve manipulations of visual images and/or items in inner speech. And these should be reportable just as easily are as manipulations of numerals on paper, or someone’s verbal utterances. There is no support for a separate self-monitoring mechanism to be had here.

It is important to note that verbalization of a propositional attitude (whether overtly or in inner speech) is unlikely to require higher-order knowledge that one has that attitude. In order to express my belief that today is Monday, I don’t first have to believe of myself that I believe that today is Monday. Rather, the occurrent belief that today is Monday just has to be taken as input by the language faculty and encoded into a suitable linguistic format. So the fact that people are highly reliable in expressing their occurrent thoughts in experimental ’think aloud’ protocols does nothing to support the idea of a self-monitoring mechanism, as Nichols and Stich allege. For there isn’t any reason to believe that people engaging in a ’think aloud’ task have any access to their thoughts independent of and prior to the expression of those thoughts in speech.

One of the main arguments that Nichols and Stich offer in support of their propositional self-monitoring mechanism, is that it would be trivially easy to implement: it just has to be capable of receiving as input any of the contents of the Belief Box or the Desire Box, and then of embedding that content as a that-clause in a suitable self-ascription. For example, if the mechanism receives the proposition P from the Belief Box, it just has to embed it to form the representation, ’I believe that P’. But this alleged simplicity is largely illusory, with the illusion stemming from the authors’ failure to distinguish between standing-state propositional attitudes and occurrent, activated ones. (This failure was noticeable in the previous chapters, too, but not in such a way as to affect the soundness of any of the arguments, I think.)

If the self-monitoring mechanism is latched onto the Belief Box, for example, and the latter is construed in such as way as to include all stored standing-state information contained in the mind, then its implementation would be anything but trivial. On the contrary, it would have to come with sophisticated search and retrieval mechanisms, since any normal human will have literally millions and millions of stored beliefs at any one time. Likewise if the self-monitoring mechanism is supposed to operate on activated beliefs: for surely there won’t be any one system in which such states will occur. On the contrary, it is highly likely that there are a whole host of different inferential mechanisms, each of which can conduct its own searches for information, and within any one of which a given belief might be active at any given time. So the self-monitoring mechanism would have be built to have access to the internal operations of each of these distinct systems. And this is just in the domain of belief; the same will be true for desires, intentions, and so on. The result looks to be anything but a simple mechanism. Rather, it will have to be built with multiple connections, spreading its tentacles octopus-like into a great many distinct systems of the mind. So the authors’ ’simplicity argument’ for a propositional self-monitoring mechanism cuts no ice.

While I have been critical of Nichols and Stich’s views on self-awareness, let me not end this review on a sour note. This is an excellent book, which anyone interested in naturalistic accounts of our abilities to pretend and to ascribe mental states to ourselves and to others needs to read.