Mindreading Animals: The Debate over What Animals Know about Other Minds

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Robert W. Lurz, Mindreading Animals: The Debate over What Animals Know about Other Minds, MIT Press, 2011, 245pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262016056.

Reviewed by Kristin Andrews, York University


To the novice, Lurz offers an engaging introduction to the research program investigating theory of mind in nonhuman animals. To the expert he offers a set of important challenges to be met. However, the longstanding question, "Does the chimpanzee (or any other critter) have a theory of mind?" is in fact not the question that Lurz addresses in this book. Rather, he focuses on the more fundamental epistemic question, "How could we know if the chimpanzee (or any other critter) has a theory of mind?" With an answer to that question, Lurz hands the matter over to empirical researchers who can work to answer the first question. Whether critters have a theory of mind, or mindread, is a question about how best to interpret animal behavior in the context of social interaction; do other animals think about individuals as seeing, believing, or desiring beings, or alternatively do they predict their behavior through some other, nonmentalistic method? The alternative methods of predicting behavior Lurz groups together as behavior reading, which include relying on contingencies between the observable cues in the environment and the target behavior, triggered stereotypical motor patterns that are innately known, and a radical mental simulation that doesn't require having mental state concepts.

Lurz here is following a tradition of philosophers intervening in the psychological examination of critter mindreading. When the topic was introduced in 1978 by psychologists David Premack and Guy Woodruff, the philosophers Gilbert Harman, Daniel Dennett, and Jonathan Bennett were among those offering commentary, and each identified a problem with inferring the ability to attribute mental states from nonverbal behavioral evidence. This problem, which Lurz dubs the logical problem, is, given that mindreaders use observable cues to infer the existence of mental states, how can we experimentally distinguish a predictor who uses only those observable cues from a predictor who also attributes mental states? The logical problem is a descendent of Skinner's worry about intervening variables: if we can predict future behavior based on environmental stimuli, there is no need to postulate a mental state in order to predict that behavior. It is the logical problem that Lurz aims to solve in this book.

To solve the problem, Lurz argues, we need not exclude every possible behavior reading alternative explanation. We merely need to exclude what he calls complementary behavior reading hypotheses, which take the same features of the environment that are used to ascribe mental states to be, by themselves, sufficient for anticipating behavior. Unfortunately, Lurz explains, such a study doesn't exist. Though in the last fifteen years there has been a resurgence in interest in animal theory of mind, Lurz argues that a complementary behavior-reading interpretation can be given for the behaviors elicited from all current research paradigms investigating ape, monkey, dolphin, and corvid mindreading.

To overcome the impasse, Lurz considers the evolution of the mindreading ability in order to determine where we might find evidence of mindreading that isn't subject to a complementary behavior reading hypothesis. If mindreading is an adaptation, Lurz claims that it would have evolved for the purpose of predicting others' behaviors in opaque environmental contexts, which are illusory perceptual settings. This idea forms the core of his Appearance-Reality Mindreading (ARM) theory, and leads Lurz to think that to avoid the logical problem, researchers should examine perceptual mindreading.

The idea of perceptual mindreading gets a significant treatment in the text. Lurz distinguishes two different kinds of perceptual mental states, which he calls perceptual appearing states and perceptual beliefs. The ability to attribute perceptual appearing states to others requires the capacity to introspect one's own perceptual state, to use introspection to distinguish appearance from reality, and to realize that perceptual errors can be made. Lurz describes the ability to recognize a perceptual error as attributing a relation of appearing to have a direct line of gaze between an agent and an object, where the object need not exist. Perceptual belief attributors require an additional ability in order to realize that other individuals are aware of the same illusion of which they are aware. Such individuals understand that other animals can revise their beliefs when presented with countervailing evidence. Note, however, what Lurz takes to be the belief attitude that such an animal would be employing. He is sympathetic to the Davidsonian argument that animals without language do not have the concepts of objectivity, truth, or falsity. Thus, Lurz is not claiming that animals may be able to attribute what he calls the object sense of belief (e.g., an attitude that is directed to a propositional attitude). Rather, for him the question about mindreading is whether animals can attribute the act sense of belief (borrowed from Arthur Prior), which is a believes-that attitude that takes a state of affairs as its object.

Though the perceptual appearing state attribution is presented as simpler than perceptual belief attribution, it is still a quite sophisticated ability insofar as it requires that the individual has an appearance-reality distinction. Lurz suggests that an individual learns the distinction between appearance and reality by introspecting her own perceptual states and then comparing those states with the actual states in illusory situations. In any plausible evolutionary scenario, it seems to me that an individual who learned this distinction would do so because she understands that she made an error, and that she made an error because of some discrepancy between appearance and reality. But this requires metacognition in terms of thinking about one's own beliefs and evidence for those beliefs, and this could be construed as mindreading (of one's self). If that's right, the significant shift between perceptual appearing attributions and perceptual belief attributions rests on the ability to reason from analogy from one's own case to the other. The perceptual appearing attributors already understand that perceptions can be in error, and that their own beliefs are revisable in light of evidence. The difference, on this view, is that the animal cannot make the same inference about others.

There is some question about whether there exist humans who understand such things about themselves but not about others, and hence we might worry whether there is a real world distinction here. According to some research on children with autism, for example, their impairments in theory of mind correlate with impairments in appearance-reality tasks. And there is also evidence against the view that typical children first come to understand their own mind, and only later, via introspection and analogy, generalize from themselves to others. Some developmental evidence suggests that children's understanding of their own minds is coupled with an understanding of other minds, and their appreciation of minds develops from infancy into adolescence. Given that this is an area of much recent research, it would have been helpful if Lurz had included a discussion of the autism and developmental literature in order to bolster the plausibility of the claim that a species could develop into perceptual appearing attributors who are not also perceptual belief attributors. Such a discussion could help show that this distinction is empirically tractable, and hence is useful to researchers examining critter mindreading.

While Lurz's treatment of the conceptual issues is important, the real payoff comes in the detailed descriptions of five experimental paradigms that could be run on chimpanzees, ravens, and dogs to test for their ability to attribute perceptual appearing state attribution, and three paradigms to be run on primates to test for perceptual belief attribution. Motivated by ARM theory, all of these paradigms examine whether individuals can make predictions based on the fact that a target is experiencing perceptual illusions, without having to first observe a correlation between the observable features of the situation and the target's behavior.

While Lurz's suggestion that we consider the evolution of mindreading in order to determine where to look for it is a sensible suggestion, his focus on perceptual mindreading may be too narrow. Lurz acknowledges that he doesn't have an account of how the concept of perceptual appearing evolved, saying that there are a number of consistent accounts. However, it is also true that there are answers to that question that would be inconsistent with the ARM theory. For example, I have argued that the evolution of mindreading stemmed from the need to offer explanations for anomalous behavior. An animal can come to realize that others see things differently from herself after seeking to explain why the other is acting in an unexpected fashion -- when confronted with a delicious food item, for example, the other doesn't eat it. Explaining behavior is evolutionarily advantageous, because it permits the spread of innovative technologies and helps to bind together a community. Without the ability to make sense of strange behavior, such as putting fresh meat into a fire, our ancestors may have been inclined to see such strange -- and seemingly destructive -- behavior as reason to ostracize the innovator, and thus would have lost out on beneficial technological advancements.

Lurz's ARM theory is a species of the Machiavellian intelligence hypothesis, which sees the evolution of mindreading as a useful adaptation in a hostile social environment. The alternative sketched above is a version of the cooperative intelligence hypothesis, which takes the evolution of mental state concepts to aid in group tasks such as hunting, technological development, and cooperative child rearing. Both are versions of the social intelligence hypothesis, and opposed to hypotheses that emphasize the role of physical demands on the development of abstract, theoretical concepts. The upshot is that there are a number of different plausible evolutionary hypotheses on the table, and we shouldn't privilege any one of them and hence limit the domain in which we search for critter mindreading.

Nonetheless, opaque perceptual situations are one plausible place to look for evidence of mindreading, so let us examine two of the proposed experimental paradigms. To examine perceptual appearing state attribution, Lurz presents a modification of Brian Hare's food competition paradigm in which a subordinate chimpanzee avoids food that a dominant can see, and seeks out the food a dominant cannot see. For Lurz's variation, first researchers train a subordinate and a dominant chimpanzee to recognize that yellow bananas are real, delicious fruit, and that orange bananas are terrible fakes. Then the subordinate alone is exposed to transparent red barriers that make real yellow bananas look like fake orange ones. After the subordinate understands how the barriers work, the test is given. A room is baited with two yellow bananas, which are on the subordinate chimpanzee's side of two transparent barriers -- one red, the other clear. Lurz says we should predict that if the subordinate knows that the yellow banana behind the red barrier looks orange to the dominant, that he will predict that the dominant will seek out the banana by the clear barrier, even though the subordinate also knows that the dominant has a direct line of gaze to both bananas. If you can attribute perceptual appearing states, the subordinate should retrieve the banana next to the red barrier (thereby avoiding being harassed by the dominant individual). In the original task, the subordinate's behavior could also be explained in terms of direct line of gaze (a facial/bodily orientation toward the target): the dominant has always eaten food to which he has a direct line of gaze; in the original study the dominant has direct line of gaze to the food in the open, but not the food behind the barrier, so the dominant will move toward the food in the open.

Lurz thinks that, unlike the other perceptual state attribution tests, there is no complementary behavior reading explanation available for successful performance on his task. I'm not sure that he is right about this. Consider that the subordinate could understand the clear transparent barriers alone as offering a direct line of gaze, and the red transparent barriers as strange blockers or modifiers of direct line of gaze. Thus, without thinking about how the yellow banana appears to the dominant, the subordinate could predict that the dominant would move toward the banana to which the dominant has a direct line of gaze, rather than to the banana to which the dominant's gaze is obstructed by an odd barrier. I expect Lurz may have a reply to this alternative explanation, and seeing more such replies in the text would be useful.

Unlike the perceptual state appearing studies, the perceptual belief attribution tasks all require that the individual is first given a pre-screening appearance-reality task. This task is based on the finding that chimpanzees, like humans, engage in amodal completion: when an object is partially obscured by another object, humans and chimpanzees see a hidden whole object. Once there is evidence that the ape subject understands the distinction between appearance and reality in this context, his understanding of belief attribution can be tested. In one paradigm, Lurz suggests developing a computer generated image of a chimpanzee in a forest, with a tree on either side of him. In the pre-training, the chimpanzee subject learns that the animated chimpanzee will move left when two different objects move onto the screen, but will move right when two similar objects move onto the screen. The testing phrase involves amodal completion abilities on the part of the subject, because the objects then come to settle behind the trees so that they are partially occluded. In some cases different objects look the same when occluded. The mindreading chimpanzee, Lurz thinks, will predict that the animation will move right when the objects look the same but are in fact different. However, the worry with this paradigm is that the subject could appear to pass this mindreading task by simply considering how the objects look to him once settled behind the tree, rather than how they looked while moving onto the screen; in the training session the subject might have not attended to the similarity or difference between the two objects until after they stopped moving. In addition, I'm not sure that there is any reason to think that the subject would be prompted to consider what the animation chimpanzee perceives in order to make his prediction. A more ecological version of this paradigm may help to avoid that worry.

In addition, there is some worry about the pre-screening amodal completion task, because it requires a chimpanzee to see an object as whole after first seeing the two separate parts, and the study that Lurz cites as evidence that chimpanzees do amodal completions does not also offer evidence that chimpanzees do this after being shown that the object is two pieces. The pre-screening task may cue the chimpanzee that there are two objects, which may eliminate the completion effect. Thus, I worry that this appearance-reality test may be based on a false view about chimpanzee perception. Of course Lurz's main goal in these sections is to motivate researchers to run the experiments, and we won't know whether this is a problem until somebody does so.

Throughout the book, the mental states that are discussed are taken as unproblematic concepts. As Lurz himself says, seeing is a simpler concept for us than is direct line of gaze. But perhaps this simplicity masks a deeper worry about the logical problem: we aren't sure what these mental states are. If they are functional terms, then insofar as direct line of gaze and seeing play the same sort of causal role in the same theory, they refer to the same thing. If they are instrumental terms, the same sort of reasoning applies -- for example, if they both describe the same robust pattern of behavior, then they are the same mental state. A neurophilosopher would say we also need to look toward the brain structures involved in these behaviors in order to determine whether our mental states are shared by critters. In the mindreading debate, animal cognition researchers have arguably been working within a framework that takes mental states to be representational, but not functional states or instrumentalist posits. Just as thinking about why mindreading may have evolved can help us to come up with new experimental paradigms, thinking about alternative theories of mind and folk psychology may be very useful.

Whether Lurz has solved the logical problem is a matter of debate. To some extent, whether he has depends on whether we have really solved it for humans. The logical problem may just be the other minds problem in sheep's clothing. Regardless, the book is an important contribution to the discussion of animal mindreading, and should be read by philosophers and psychologists working on the topic. It is clear enough to serve as an introduction, and sophisticated enough to challenge the status quo.