Minds Without Fear: Philosophy in the Indian Renaissance

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Nalini Bhushan and Jay L. Garfield, Minds Without Fear: Philosophy in the Indian Renaissance, Oxford University Press, 2017, 334pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780190457594.

Reviewed by Christian Coseru, College of Charleston


A prevailing view among specialists is that Indian philosophy "proper" can only be philosophy written in Sanskrit and a few other Prakrits (any of the several Middle Indo-Aryan vernaculars formerly spoken in India), in a doxographical style, and along more or less clearly drawn scholastic lines. As such, it encompasses the entirety of speculative and systematic thought in India up to the advent of British colonial rule in the 19th Century. Doing Indian philosophy, then, is not unlike doing classical Greek philosophy: one reads and interprets texts, analyzes their views and arguments, and evaluates their plausibility relative to norms of truth and meaning that -- given the demands of authenticity -- must be internal to that tradition. By contrast, philosophy done outside this scholastic tradition of commentary and debate, as was the case during (and immediately after) the period of British rule, does not count as Indian philosophy and should not be engaged as such.

Minds Without Fear challenges this dominant view of the history of Indian philosophy. As Nalini Bhushan and Jay Garfield explain in their introduction, this view is symptomatic of what they call the "tragedy of Indian philosophy": a widespread anxiety about writing in English that endures in India to the present day coupled with the "denigration . . . of Anglophone Indian philosophy" (p. 5) produced during the colonial period. A case in point is Daya Krishna's (1924-2007) infamously laconic and trenchant statement that "anybody who is writing in English is not an Indian philosopher" because the "Indian mind and sensibility and thinking [during the colonial period] was shaped by an alien civilization" (p. 10).

That the advent of British rule in India wrought fundamental changes to its social and cultural fabric is a truism. The question remains: what to make of the hybrid philosophical enterprises that took shape during the Raj? Bhushan and Garfield think these deep anxieties about Europeanisation may have had a prejudicial effect, and that Anglophone Indian philosophy during the Raj deserves reevaluation. Rather than marking a break with the past and a loss of the "authentic" character of their philosophical endeavors, the adoption of yet another "vernacular," albeit one alien to its cultural milieu -- in this case, "English" -- exposed Indian thinkers during the 19th and early 20th century to European ideas, resulting in a "fecund interaction." Indian philosophy produced in English during the Raj does not mark a radical departure from its indigenous cultural forms so much as their appropriation in the service of intercultural philosophy. While necessarily politically fraught (given the status of English as the language of colonial power), the new vernacular became a vehicle for Enlightenment ideas of rationality and scientific progress, and served as a new "scholarly metalanguage" in the formation of a modern Indian philosophical canon.

These widespread anxieties about the predicament of philosophy in colonial India are also symptomatic of a deep skepticism -- all too familiar to scholars of cross-cultural philosophy -- about the possibility of articulating the insights of one's own tradition in a language shaped by another. How could one effectively render the thought-world of Sanskrit using the conceptual vocabulary of a modern Western language shaped by the Greek culture of the first millennium BCE, the scholasticism of the Latin Middle Ages, and the European enlightenment? While Bhushan and Garfield don't think these anxieties are completely unfounded, they reject the stronger claim that mastery of an altogether different conceptual idiom impairs creativity or renders one's own tradition opaque to oneself. Specifically, they reject the premise that English was (and is) perforce an alien medium for doing Indian philosophy.

The main obstacle in reclaiming Anglophone colonial philosophy as genuinely Indian, argue Bhushan and Garfield, is a dilemma that its chief protagonists faced as they embarked on their new project: "is one pursuing Indian philosophy or Western philosophy? . . . Is Indian philosophy the systematic pursuit of philosophical ideals; is it the history of its own embalmed tradition; or is it essentially a kind of comparative philosophy?" (p. 10). If the picture of Indian philosophy presented by Indian authors during the colonial period is a distortion precisely because it is written in English, and thus indebted to Western conceptions and categories, what hope is there in ever breaking the language barrier? Can one ever genuinely think across cultural boundaries?

In addressing this dilemma Bhushan and Garfield look both backward, to the emergence of an Indian modern sensibility in the precolonial period, and forward, to certain problematic developments in academic philosophy in the postcolonial period. The result is a new story of how philosophy in India, hitherto confined to the Hindu religious maths and, from the 16th century onwards, also to the madrasas of the Mughal empire, took a trajectory that would bring it in direct dialogue and confrontation with modernity, and the aftermath of that confrontation following independence and the formation of a postcolonial identity. This narrative hinges on a liberal understanding of English as the vehicle of a new (albeit at first colonial) cosmopolitanism of wider scale and scope than Sanskrit had hitherto afforded. But the work of rehabilitating this much-maligned chapter in recent intellectual history cannot proceed without a clear diagnostic. Ill-feelings about the hegemonic effects of English had resulted in a "failure of recognition" of its seminal role as a new scholarly language that progressively led to "an inability to understand the productive dynamics" of this "cosmopolitan colonial context" (p. 12). Anglophone philosophers under the Raj were not "abject subjects" but "intellectual agents" and should be engaged as such.

The book focuses on three important moments that define this period of transition, which paved the way for a veritable Indian Renaissance: (i) the emergence of a quasi-secular philosophical sensibility among administrative elites from the seventeenth century onwards (the karaṇam of South India and the munshī of the Northern, Mughal kingdoms); (ii) the transition from a largely oral, memorization- and recitation-based model of the Sanskrit maths to the open-ended process of asking questions and pursuing answers of Anglophone philosophy during the colonial period; and (iii) the struggle for intellectual and political emancipation at the individual and social levels, centered on the Gandhian notions of swaraj ("self-rule") and swadeshi ("self-sufficiency") in the decades leading up to India's independence.

A staple of colonial and postcolonial discourse, this Gandhian categorical framework serves as a valuable tool for framing the debate about the status of Anglophone Indian philosophy. Bhushan and Garfield use it to great rhetorical effect in telling their alternative story:

the very characteristics often identified as videsi ["foreign"] in colonial Indian philosophy are as desi ["native"] as one could ever want. The use of English . . . as a scholarly metalanguage and as a pan-Indian lingua franca in which Indian scholars comfortably dwell has a clear precedent in Persian, which played precisely this role for centuries of Mughal rule. (p. 37)

Central to this narrative is the question of modernity: does Indian philosophy contain its own Cartesian moment or is modernity a foreign import? This crucial question has been addressed before, most notably by Jonardon Ganeri (2012), who has argued that certain intellectual innovations principally associated with Ragunātha Śiroṃani (1460-1540), Yaśovijaya Gaṇi (1624-1688), and Gadādhara (c.1604-1709) warrant treating their work as ushering in a modernity independent of, and prior to, the advent of British colonial rule in the 19th century. While sympathetic to this view, Bhushan and Garfield treat this emergent "proto-modernity" not necessarily as the logical outcome of previous moves in Indian philosophy; rather, they see it as a contingent matter, a social phenomenon reflecting the ethos and administrative demands of the Mughal Court. Great Mughal rulers like Akbar (r. 1556-1605) and Jehangir (r. 1605-1627) encouraged liberal scientific inquiry, and were celebrated for their tolerance and secularism. They also patronized open debates on religious matters, often on the traditional Sanskritic model of philosophical discourse, and relied on a class of administrators that were required to keep their religious and secular pursuits aside. Hence, the modern sensibility of the Anglophone Indian thinker is already foreshadowed in his Persophone forebear.

The first half of the book follows the familiar thread of religious, social, and intellectual reform movements: from the monotheistic reformist agenda of Ram Mohan Roy (1772-1833) and Dayanand Saraswati (1824-1883), leaders of the Brahmo and Arya Samaj movements, to the aesthetic nationalism of Rabindranath Tagore (1861-1941) and Ananda Coomaraswamy (1877-1947), and finally to the contested visions of spiritual and secular nationalism of Mahatma Gandhi (1869-1948), Aurobindo Ghose (1872-1950), and Jawaharlal Nehru (1889-1964). There is little original material here, and the attempt to wrest some grand philosophical insight about the metaphysics of freedom from what is essentially a cursory recapping of key moments in the emergence of India's national consciousness, is less successful than one might have hoped.

It is in the second half of the book that the contributions of Anglophone Indian philosophy come out in sharper focus as readers are introduced to its main protagonists. Among them, Mysore Hiriyana (1871-1950) is shown to have articulated a conception of aesthetic experience inextricably tied to the Hindu experience of liberation (mokṣa), and thus to have put forward a conception of art as a vehicle for spiritual insight. K.C. Bhattacharyya (1875-1949), one of the most prominent Indian philosophers during the colonial period, comes across as a brilliant interpreter of Kant's idealism through the lens of Vedānta, and an original thinker in his own right whose stance on the reference of subject terms -- "we can talk about ourselves, even though there is no term that can mean the self" (p. 265) -- is said to anticipate both Wittgenstein and Sellars. In A.C. Mukerjee (1888-1968), who is dubbed the "Plato of Allahabad," one finds a robust defense of the "rational intelligibility of the world" (p. 251) and a well-developed philosophy of mind program centered on detailed investigations of consciousness and self-knowledge. Several other authors, including the poet and philosopher Muhammad Iqbal (1877-1938), are shown to have made important contributions to metaphysics, epistemology, philosophy of language, and ethics, by adapting various strands of Hindu (and Muslim) thought to the prevailing movements of 19th century Western thought, in particular to the different strands of Kantian and neo-Hegelian idealism associated with F. H. Bradley (1846-1924), Bernard Bosanquet (1848-1923), and J. M. E. McTaggart (1866-1925).

That none of these Indian philosophers had an impact on the development of Anglophone philosophy in the West would be lamentable were it not for their equally obscure status at home. Important and innovative as their contributions may be, why bring them to light now? Because, argue Bhushan and Garfield, they both articulate and inhabit the tension of a cosmopolitan moment in the history of philosophy, East and West, not unlike our own: as curiously hybrid "denizens of a masala modernity" (p. 318), these Anglophone Indian philosophers are the forerunners of our own postcolonial globalized world. They are "minds without fear" because they "freely embraced both classical and modern thought, both Indian and European philosophy, both public and private reason" (p. 318).

It is hard to be critical of such a worthy attempt to recover a forgotten chapter in the history of Indian philosophy, but the celebratory tone Bhushan and Garfield adopt throughout (concluding with a statement on "The Triumph of Indian Philosophy") would no doubt strike many readers as overly optimistic, if not downright naïve, especially since it is predicated on a questionable conception of philosophy's relation to its own history. Taking philosophy, in a Hegelian vein, to be "the discipline that contains its own history" (p. 319) assumes a consensus about the purpose that the historiography of philosophy should serve in contemporary academic philosophy that just does not exist. As is well known, prevailing trends in the first decades of post-Second World War Anglophone philosophy to distance philosophy from its history resulted in a conception of philosophy as an exclusively argumentative enterprise. But even those who see philosophy's history as indispensable to its contemporary pursuits disagree about how best to approach it. Some think it is best treated as a repository of ideas and arguments to be mined for current philosophical projects as one sees fit; others that it should be studied diligently and for its own sake irrespective of its relevance to contemporary philosophy; while those trained in the so-called Continental tradition argue that it is best engaged dialectically such that, as Mogens Lærke, Justin E. H. Smith, and Eric Schliesser (2013) have recently argued, one's own philosophical position is developed within "a tradition that is often simultaneously constructed for that purpose" (p. 3).

Bhushan and Garfield's conception of philosophy's relation to its history would seem to place them in the company of those who think engagement with the history of philosophy ought to attempt to make a positive contribution to current philosophy. In doing so they face the sort of criticism familiar to all philosophers, Indian and Western alike, who argue for the relevance of culturally distant past thinkers to current debates: to do so is to engage in a one-way conversation, since long-dead philosophers cannot say anymore beyond what they have already stated, whereas we can constantly expand and revise our views. A better strategy calls for owning up and calling this approach what it actually is: a type of philosophical intervention from one tradition to another with consequences for both. Such interventions, which abound in the cross-cultural philosophical literature, can be (and often are) turbulent events. But they can also provide an effective platform from which to interrogate hegemonic forms of language, thought, and morality (cf. Coseru 2018).

What might temper this criticism, at least in part, is that this book is less history of philosophy and more intellectual history. Indeed, some of its best chapters (e.g., "The Company and Crown: Macaulay's India?";"The Cambridge Connection: Idealism, Modernity, and the Circulation of Ideas;" and "Māyā versus Līlā: From Śaṅkarācharya to Einstein") make for a compelling read as the destinies of a motley cast of characters -- orientalists and colonial administrators, pundits and professors, Scottish missionaries and Hindu spiritual leaders, secular intellectuals and revolutionaries -- get progressively untangled.

One last observation about the target audience: unlike many such works in recent years, which are aimed at mainstream Western readers, this book is aimed primarily at Anglophone philosophers in India and the Indian diaspora. That alone should not lessen its appeal to a broader audience, and just about any philosopher with an interest in the varieties of moral and metaphysical possibility shall find in it many interesting points of contact. It is also worth mentioning that it is a companion volume to Bhushan and Garfield's anthology of philosophy in India during the colonial period, Indian Philosophy in English: From Renaissance to Independence (Oxford University Press, 2011). Readers wishing to explore further the views of these colonial Indian philosophers would benefit from having the two works side by side, given constant reference to the latter.

Changing received attitudes toward any philosophical tradition, let alone one as maligned as Anglophone Indian philosophy during the Raj, is no small task. These minor points of criticism aside, Bhushan and Garfield are to be commended for their thoroughly documented and meticulously argued stance on the achievements of Indian philosophers during this period.


Coseru, C. 2018. "Interpretations or Interventions? Indian Philosophy in the Global Cosmopolis" in P. Bilimoria, ed. Routledge History of Indian Philosophy, London: Routledge.

Ganeri, J. 2012. The Lost Age of Reason: Philosophy in Early Modern India:1450-1700. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Lærke, M., Smith, Justin E. H., and E. Schliesser, (Eds.). 2013. Philosophy and Its History: Aims and Methods in the Study of Early Modern Philosophy. Oxford: Oxford University Press.