Minds without Meanings: An Essay on the Content of Concepts

Placeholder book cover

Jerry A. Fodor and Zenon W. Pylyshyn, Minds without Meanings: An Essay on the Content of Concepts, MIT Press, 2015, 193pp., $30.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262027908.

Reviewed by Frank Jackson, Australian National University


A major topic in cognitive science is how what goes on inside us tracks what is happening around us. How do processes inside us, connected in one way or another to our neural states, 'tell us' that some object has been encountered before? How do our brains mark the difference between an object's moving towards us and our moving towards it? And so on. We can all agree that these are important questions in cognitive science, but how do they connect with the questions that dominate much recent work in the philosophy of mind and language?

One way to forge the connection is via a causal theory of reference set within RTM -- the representational theory of mind most especially associated with the first-named co-author of this book. Thoughts are mental representations that, as a matter of fact, are or are realized in neural states. They express propositions. They are compositional in somewhat (somewhat) the way sentences that express propositions are, and some of their parts express concepts. These parts will have various causal connections with happenings around us, and some of these causal connections will, the causal theory of reference tells us, be what makes it the case that these parts refer to this, that or the other thing. On this way of forging the connection, the heavy lifting is being handed over to the notion of reference understood in a broadly causal way. But now we have an obvious question to address. Don't we need, in the philosophy of mind and language, a notion of sense or meaning in addition to a notion of reference, and the distinction between intension and extension?

Jerry Fodor and Zenon Pylyshyn's guiding idea is that we had better be able to manage with reference alone, for reference, understood in causal terms, is the only naturalistically respectable weapon at our disposal. As they put it, "we think that PRS [purely referential semantics] is the only available candidate for a naturalistic science of cognition" (p. 147). Well it isn't quite that simple (of course). We can give ourselves more than reference alone, but what we cannot do, they urge, is give ourselves anything much like the traditional notions of meaning, sense, and intension. Thus the "Minds without Meanings" in the title of their book.

This review has a negative part and a second, positive part. The negative part concerns the authors' treatment of some of the cases that suggest that reference alone is not enough. The positive part concerns a different way they might have sought to put reference center stage.

Fodor and Pylyshyn worry about concepts with empty extensions, and are upfront about this: "We do agree, of course, that they [empty concepts] are prima facie counterexamples [to PRS]. But we don't agree that they are remotely decisive prima facie counterexamples" (p. 147). The worry for them is that empty concepts and terms seem to provide examples of semantically distinct terms and concepts with the very same null extension. Fodor and Pylyshyn distinguish three kinds of cases of empty concepts that call for discussion: scientific idealisations, mistakes in natural history, and fictions in the sense in which Tonto is a fiction. There is, for example, a big difference between the term "frictionless plane" and the corresponding concept, on the one hand, and the term "ideal gas" and the corresponding concept, on the other. Traditionally minded theorists will talk of the difference lying in a difference in sense, or intension, or meaning, but that route is barred to our authors. Likewise, there is a big difference between, on the one hand, "unicorn" and the corresponding concept, and, on the other, "griffin" and the corresponding concept. The same goes for "Tonto" and "The Lone Ranger".

What Fodor and Pylyshyn seek to do is, in one way or another, undermine our intuition that there are semantic differences, properly speaking, in these cases. As they say, "Intuitions are sometimes evidence for (against) semantic theories; but they are never constitutive of the truth (falsity) of semantic theories. They work much the way that observational reports do in the hard sciences; one has to take them seriously, but they're fallible" (pp. 146-47, their emphasis).

The trouble for Fodor and Pylyshyn is that the differences are semantic on any reasonable sense of that term. And the case for this has nothing especially to do with intuitions about the non-synonymy of, for example, "unicorn" and "griffin"; the case is one a Quinean skeptic about synonymy versus non-synonymy might embrace. Moreover, the case can be made without using the terms "meaning" or "intension". People once believed in unicorns and griffins (so I am told; if I am wrong, the atheists among us can make the needed points with the example of the devil and god). They used "unicorn" and "griffin" to make claims about how things are, and our grasp of what they were claiming is a good part of why we do not agree with them. But, of course, what was being claimed differed; which is why the reasons for not believing in unicorns differ from the reasons for not believing in griffins. Again, when mathematicians mark examination papers with questions containing the terms "frictionless plane" and "ideal gas" in them, they know which answers are correct and which are incorrect precisely because their understanding of the terms and possession of the corresponding concepts allows them, the markers, to know what counts as a correct answer, and of course what counts as a correct answer will differ depending on whether the question is about frictionless planes or ideal gases. Fiction is notoriously tricky, but the basic picture is the same. We know how writers are representing things to be in the fiction through our understanding of the terms and possession of the corresponding concepts, and how they are representing things to be differs depending on whether they use, say, "Tonto" or "Sherlock Holmes" in one or another sentence in the fiction.

There is, of course, a sense of "reference" in which the differences we talk about in the previous paragraph are to do with reference. "Unicorn", for instance, has a reference in the following sense: there is a way something has to be for "is a unicorn" to be true of it. It is our grasp of this that makes us confident that "There are unicorns" is false -- nothing is the right way, and this way is different from the way something has to be for "is a griffin" to be true of it. This indeed is why we have to count the 'unicorn-griffin' difference as a semantic one; it goes along with a difference in how things are being said to be by the use of the terms. But this is not the sense of "reference" that figures in their discussion (more on this below).

Fodor and Pylyshyn also worry about reference to the very small. They point out that "even back when paramecia were too small to see [that is, when there were no microscopes], they could perfectly well be referred to" (p. 147). Why is this a problem for them? The reason lies in their focus on the question we opened with: how does what happens inside us track goings on outside us? To which their answer is, in the "core cases" (p. 85), by causally responding to what is, to use their term, inside the perceptual circle (PC). There is a whole chapter (ch. 4, "Reference within the Perceptual Circle: Experimental Evidence for Mechanisms of Perceptual Reference") on how these responses relate to and encode what is in our PCs. But very small things like paramecia did not make distinctive impacts on what goes on inside us in the days before microscopes. So Fodor and Pylyshyn worry about how we were able to refer to them back then.

I found their response to this worry puzzling. Let me quote what they say; the quote also serves to give a sense of their overall position.

a viable metaphysics of reference must be able to explain how they [paramecia] could have been referred to before they were in anyone's PC. The answer seems clear enough from the point of view of the kind of causal theory of reference that we endorse: reference requires a causal chain connecting tokens of mental representation to their referents. In paradigm cases of visual perception, one of the links in the chain is the reflection of light from a distal object onto sensory transducers that respond to them. It used to be that there were no such chains, but then Leeuwenhoek invented the microscope, and now there are. In particular we now can say what they then were referring to when they spoke of paramecia. (p. 147, their emphasis)

The puzzle is that Fodor and Pylyshyn are supposed to be explaining how, by the lights of their view of reference, reference to paramecia was possible before there were microscopes; what they offer is an account of how, by the lights of their view of reference, reference to paramecia was possible after there were microscopes.

One might wonder whether they would have done better to deny that reference to paramecia was possible before there were microscopes. But clearly researchers might have postulated the existence of paramecia ahead of confirming their postulation when microscopes came along, and in postulating the existence of paramecia, they were referring to them. When microscopes came along, it wasn't as if they were confirming the existence of something else -- that would have been refutation not confirmation. (As it happens, I do not know whether paramecia were postulated ahead of their observation using microscopes, but there are obviously many examples of very small things that were postulated ahead of their observation using microscopes.)

It is time to turn positive. We will start with what Fodor and Pylyshyn say about the best-known cases that philosophers appeal to in arguing for intensions, or senses, or meanings, or something in that ballpark; the kinds of cases associated especially with Frege. Fodor and Pylyshyn "grant that, for example, 'George Washington' . . . and 'our first president' . . . though co-extensive, aren't synonyms" (p. 67). They might equally have discussed a Quine-inspired example like "creature with a liver" and "creature with a kidney", which has the advantage of steering clear of controversies over proper names. Later, as you would expect, they discuss the morning star-evening star example (p. 74). I won't rehearse the ins and outs of their discussion of these cases. It occupies much of ch. 3 (which has the informative title "Contrarian Semantics"). The overall message of their discussion is that the notions philosophers invoke in their discussion of the examples cannot be made naturalistically respectable. Although there's lots of talk in the philosophical literature about synonymy or lack of it, of how belief reports can change their truth value when one name is replaced by a co-referring name or definite description, of how intensions determine extension, of the difference between good and bad translations, of differences in what gets communicated, etc., none of these notions can be given a proper scientific foundation. This is what they have in mind, I take it, when they speak of "the really hopeless failure of cognitive science to devise a remotely plausible account of conceptual/lexical content" (p. 77). Their message is as we say above: the only way forward is via reference, thought of in causal terms and embedded in RTM.

There is, however, a way of thinking about the famous examples that makes no mention of intensions, senses, meanings, etc. and is in terms of reference understood in causal terms. It insists that we can have thoughts about properties as well as about things, and the explanation of how this is possible goes back to the way our brains, and what happens inside us more generally, carry traces of the kinds of things to be found around us. Indeed, one way of thinking about a causal theory of reference is as a theory very roughly based on the idea that what happens inside us carries information about the properties instantiated in and around us. To use the old gas gauge example: the position of the pointer carries information about the level of gas left in the tank by virtue of its causal co-variance with that level.

This allows one to explicate the difference between, for example, "creature with a liver" and "creature with a kidney" in referential terms. Although the terms are co-extensive (ditto for the corresponding concepts), we can think of the terms as referring to different properties: being a creature with a liver is a different property from being a creature with a kidney. Or take the example from Fodor and Pylyshyn that we discussed earlier: the difference between the terms "unicorn" and "griffin" (and the corresponding concepts). The property of being a unicorn differs from the property of being a griffin, and we can think of the relationship between the terms and concepts, on the one hand, and the properties on the other, as a relation properly thought of as a kind of reference. Indeed, we gave some words for one way of thinking of that relationship earlier: the property that "unicorn" refers to in this sense is the way something has to be for "is a unicorn'" to be true of it.

Fodor and Pylyshyn may not like that way of saying things, but it is very much a representationalist way of thinking about the issues on the table, and is a kind of phrasing they themselves use when talking about the kind of theories of mind that they like. Here is a passage: "Representational theories of mind say that's because wanting to eat an apple involves being related, in the appropriate way, to a mental representation of how things would be if you got what you want" (p. 60, my emphasis).

Also, Fodor and Pylyshyn themselves talk of causal connections with instances of kinds and properties in broadly referential ways in ch. 4. For one example, they talk there of what needs to happen "for encoding some properties of objects in the visual field, especially for encoding conjunctions of properties" to occur (p. 91, my emphasis).

So this reader at least was left wondering why Fodor and Pylyshyn do not frame at least part of their referential story, their PRS, in terms of reference thought of as relating mental representations to properties. But now we have an obvious question: how different would the resulting picture then be from that to be found in the tradition that talks of senses and intensions? (Full disclosure: I am named in the book as one of those who talks of intensions.)