Mindshaping: A New Framework for Understanding Human Social Cognition

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Tadeusz Wieslaw Zawidzki, Mindshaping: A New Framework for Understanding Human Social Cognition, MIT Press, 2013, 317pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262019019.

Reviewed by Bryce Huebner, Georgetown University


Nietzsche famously claims that "the task of breeding an animal that is permitted to promise includes, as condition and preparation, the more specific task of first making man to a certain degree necessary, uniform, like among like, regular, and accordingly predictable." Tadeusz Zawidzki uses resources drawn from the cognitive and biological sciences to establish a similar conclusion. He claims that we can only understand one another as agents with determinate propositional attitudes because we find ourselves at the end of a long process that has made human thought and behavior more homogeneous, uniform, and predictable. Zawidzki examines the ways in which imitation, pedagogy, norm enforcement, linguistic frameworks, and group-constituting narratives shape human social cognition.  In the process he provides a compelling case for the hypothesis that the 'human sociocognitive syndrome' is the result of a sophisticated kind of social niche construction (p. 20). He argues that we possess sophisticated tools for regulating thought and behavior, and that these tools serve as the linchpin for a distinctly human sociocognitive syndrome that includes robust forms of mentalizing and cooperation, as well as complex and flexible forms of symbolic communication. This opens up new ways of thinking about the evolution of mentalizing, culture, and belief.  Even if some of the arguments are unsound, the core hypothesis of Mindshaping is likely to be true. To see why, it will help to take a step back to see what mindshaping amounts to.

Matteo Mameli (2001) coined the term 'mindshaping' to characterize a kind of social bootstrapping in which ascriptions of mental states evoke social expectancies, which in turn cause the emergence of those states. For example, gendered expectations about the emotional repertoires of young girls often lead to prohibitions against playing with toys 'designed for boys' and to exclusion from 'boyish' activities (among countless other forms of social policing); this yields different patterns of experience, which can have a significant impact on self-understanding and can evoke behavior that confirms expectancies about gender (Mameli 2001, 612-613). I won't belabor the point, as similar suggestions are familiar in many parts of philosophy (though neither Mameli nor Zawidzki acknowledges the affinities with Althusser's [1971] account of interpellation and Foucault's analyses of surveillance and social policing). Surprisingly, mindshaping has failed to take hold as a plausible hypothesis in the cognitive sciences, and Zawidzki aims to rectify this situation by showing that mindshaping has played an integral role in the evolution of human social cognition.

As I noted above, Zawidzki's primary concern is with our surprising ability to accurately ascribe rationally justified intentional states to others. The problem is that beliefs, desires, hopes, and wishes can be decoupled from detectable patters of behavior; they are also inferentially promiscuous, and dependent on holistically structured networks of inferential practice. This seems to make such states computationally intractable, and their weirdness makes it unclear why animals would ever evolve the capacity to accurately ascribe them. But they have, and it is often claimed that complex machinery evolved to facilitate these ascriptions. Received wisdom has it that human social cognition is the end result of a protracted Machiavellian game of hide-and-seek.  Some organisms developed the capacity to 'hide' their mental states from competitors; but this made it advantageous to develop inferential capacities that could uncover hidden states; and this made more sophisticated capacities for 'hiding' mental states valuable.  The game then continued until the full-blown capacity for ascribing propositional states emerged in the vicinity of humans or our recent ancestors. It's a nice story, but Zawidzki doesn't buy it, and the best arguments in Mindshaping are designed to show that many phenomena that appear to require sophisticated mindreading are better explained by appeal to computationally-light assumptions about rational goal-pursuit.

This argument builds on data from developmental psychology, which suggests that young infants rely on a simple form of behavior-reading that is indifferent to the nature of the 'agents' being tracked. They treat boxes, hands, people, and teddy bears as agents that form goals and rely on "rationally and informationally constrained means of achieving them" (p. 183). Where the links between goals and behavior are relatively clear, such behavior-reading requires nothing more than assuming that every agent takes the most efficient means to achieving its goals. Zawidzki notes that this insight has important ramifications. Assumptions about efficient goal-pursuit can be coupled to evolutionarily old capacities for tracking action-outcome contingencies, leading to a sophisticated form of behavior-reading that looks a lot like the intentional stance (Dennett 1987). But this isn't the end of the story. Zawidzki contends that the ability to ascribe genuine propositional attitudes is distinct from the ability to track behavior with the intentional stance, in part because behavior-reading mechanisms are insufficient to track holistically structured propositional attitudes. Assuming efficiency is nice when there are clear links between goals and actions, but the links between beliefs about democracy, racial equality, and urban gentrification are often quite tenuous. Observed patterns of behavior rarely provide unambiguous evidence about the abstract beliefs and desires of others, and similar actions can result from a variety of holistically structured and isotropic networks of beliefs and desires.

Of course, we could use simulations of our own mental states to cut down on the computational costs of interpreting others. But it would be unwise to assume that others had beliefs and desires like ours unless we had reason to suppose that they were enough like us for this strategy to be accurate, at least most of the time. While this assumption is reasonable where powerful evolutionary forces shape the links between goals and strategies for achieving them, it is illicit where abstract beliefs and desires are concerned -- except where links between thought and behavior have been subjected to powerful forms of mindshaping (p. 81). And this brings us to the core of the mindshaping hypothesis.

Zawidzki claims that nonhuman animals engage in rudimentary forms of behavior-shaping, which provide a foundation for the gradual evolution of human social cognition. Colonies of non-human primates, for example, institute and track social hierarchies, and police their boundaries using 'big sticks' to solidify local norms governing things like feeding, grooming, and mating. Although human mindshaping builds on this foundation, it takes a distinctive form that stretches beyond the behaviorally-focused strategies available to nonhuman primates (p. 20). We use forward-looking virtual models to bring about new possibilities, instead of simply observing action-outcome contingencies for violations; this makes human mindshaping extraordinarily flexible. Human mindshaping also exploits wide-ranging networks of social practice, and this is made possible by the fact that we find many types of norm-conformity intrinsically rewarding (Klucharev et al 2009; 2011). Finally, we use linguistically-structured narratives to shape thought and behavior, opening up a wealth of possibilities unavailable to non-human animals.

By coupling his account of the evolution of behavior-reading to his claims about the unique forms of mindshaping we find in humans, Zawidzki is able to offer an intriguing alternative to the Machiavellian view discussed above. He claims that the task of predicting human behavior was "made more tractable not by providing interpreters with a more powerful theory of mind but by making targets of interpretation easier to interpret using low-cost computations capable of tracking observable behavioral dispositions" (p. 69). Sophisticated mindshaping solidified the links between observable behavior and unobservable mental states, and this made inferences about mental states less risky, and more tractable using only simple computational mechanisms. In sum: the

cognitive homogeneity that results from pervasive mindshaping in human populations makes our virtuosity at adopting the intentional stance possible, because it makes it more likely that interpreters and their targets attend to similar information and make similar judgments of means-ends rationality (p. 205).

In light of this argument Zawidzki concludes his book with a discussion of the role and value of propositional attitudes ascriptions. He argues that such ascriptions are not particularly common, and that they are not essential to most everyday engagements. This is an important point that is too rarely acknowledged in empirical discussions of mentalizing. But as Zawidzki rightly notes, such ascriptions are part of the mindshaping toolbox we rely on; they play an important role in the exculpatory narratives we tell, and they allow us to explain and justify our behavior when it diverges from social norms and practices (TZ, personal communication).

Zawidzki's arguments are sophisticated, and I can't do justice to them in this short review. But I hope to have given a sense of his view. There is much to admire about the book, and it is an enjoyable read (though the numerous endnotes -- many of which are crucial to the overall argument -- detract somewhat from the readability of this otherwise well-crafted book). But at the end of the day, I wonder how radical Zawidzki's arguments are. By his own report, the arguments demonstrate that capacities for sophisticated mindshaping, cooperation, and symbolic communication don't depend on the capacity for sophisticated mindreading, "understood as the attribution of full-blown propositional attitudes, with tenuous, holistically constrained causal influence over behavior" (p. 206). I think this must be right, and it is striking that many people have assumed otherwise. The problem lies in the (often tacit) assumption that we must recover previously existing belief-like states using sophisticated cognitive tools to get around in our world. By acknowledging that our day-to-day interactions rarely even require ascribing propositional attitudes, the value of mindshaping becomes obvious, while the necessity of mentalizing capacities begins to feel like an evolutionary afterthought. Zawidzki is swimming upstream! But those who are less sympathetic to neo-Cartesian theories should already feel at home with a mindshaping hypothesis.

That said, the core hypothesis of Mindshaping could benefit from a closer analysis of cognitive and social mechanisms. Zawidzki paints a plausible picture of the relationship between mindshaping and mindreading. But his arguments are often hard to evaluate as causal claims about the structure of the human mind. Consider his claim that the pressure toward homogeneity in human populations depends on sophisticated forms of mindshaping. We use social narratives and complex forms of surveillance to police the boundaries we have drawn around different kinds of people, and this is a point where Mindshaping would benefit from engagement with the intricate phenomenology one finds in Althusser, Deleuze, and Foucault. As these authors note, many strategies for shaping human behavior depend on things that Zawidzki would probably classify as behavior-shaping. Like most biological organisms, we form expectations in light of Pavlovian contingencies between rewards and conditioned stimuli; and like many other animals, we can develop behavioral policies linking actions to rewarding outcomes (including social rewards). At the core of biological cognition, we find neural mechanisms that can be attuned to the rewards and punishments that are built into the structure of our lived environment, or instituted in various kinds of cultural scaffolding. This kind of attunement that tracks these rewards and punishments is plausibly driven computationally simple mechanisms. Zawidzki wouldn't deny this. But he and I disagree about the extent to which social niche construction depends on the distinctively human sociocognitive syndrome (TZ, personal communication). I see a great deal of continuity between the behavior-shaping we find in non-human animals and the mindshaping that occurs in human culture, and I think that approaching things in this way helps to suggest a slightly different approach to the evolution of human social cognition.

The behavior-shaping and minimal mindshaping afforded by the intentional stance may have produced an evolutionary niche in which minimal-mentalizing could arise; minimal-mentalizing might in turn have provided the interpretive capacities necessary for linguistic communication (Bloom 2002), which would have made it possible to generate the richer representations of goals and values. These goals and values could then be redeployed as virtual representations in sophisticated, culturally-instituted mindshaping practices, and the ability to ascribe propositional attitudes could then evolve by interfacing the ability to produce virtual representations with existent mechanisms dedicated to minimal-mindreading. I maintain that a plausible explanation of the evolution of sophisticated mentalizing must advert to the ways in which reward-risk machinery was repurposed, and I contend that the ability to construct forward-looking policies and rules had to be in place before the reward-risk machinery could be co-opted to play a role in sophisticated mindshaping practices. Indeed, I think it is reasonable to suppose that language and some type of culture emerged prior to sophisticated mindshaping, piggybacking on the behavior-shaping and minimal mindshaping afforded by the intentional stance. It would take a lot to establish this, and doing so would depend on many of the arguments that have been advanced by Zawidzki. But I think that it is worthwhile to attempt to develop this alternative picture.

I would urge the development of an alternative approach that could avoid one of the more questionable moves that Zawidzki makes in explaining the evolution of human social cognition. He appeals to group selection as a means of stabilizing cooperation, and that's a big check to cash, especially if there are other ways of defending the mindshaping hypothesis. As Zawidzki notes, we find many types of social conformity intrinsically rewarding. And as Read Montague (2007) argues, this is because of the ways in which risk- and reward-based mechanisms are interfaced with the working memory systems that allow us to represent socially-shared goals and values. Perhaps behavior-shaping, minimal mindshaping, and minimal mindreading afford enough resources to explain how we came to track the value of the rewards associated with cooperation. But developing an account of this process would take at least a few articles, if not a book of its own. And this is the primary reason why Mindshaping is such an important book: it opens up new questions and new strategies for approaching these kinds of issues.


Althusser, L. (1971). Ideology and Ideological State Apparatuses. Lenin and Philosophy and other Essays. Ben Brewster (trans.). London: New Left Books, 121-176.

Bloom, P. (2002). Mindreading, communication, and the learning of names for things. Mind and Language, 17, 1, 37-54.

Dennett, D. (1987). The intentional stance. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

Klucharev V., Hytönen K., Rijpkema M., Smidts A., Fernández G. (2009). Reinforcement learning signal predicts social conformity. Neuron 61, 140-151.

Klucharev V., Munneke M., Smidts A., Fernández G. (2011). Downregulation of the posterior medial frontal cortex prevents social conformity. Journal of Neuroscience. 31, 11934-11940.

Mameli, M. (2001). Mindreading, mindshaping, and evolution. Biology and Philosophy, 16 (5): 595-626.

Montague, R. (2007). Your brain is (almost) perfect. New York: Plume.