Ministers of the Law: A Natural Law Theory of Legal Authority

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Jean Porter, Ministers of the Law: A Natural Law Theory of Legal Authority, Eerdmans, 2010, 368pp., $30.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780802865632.

Reviewed by Gary Chartier, La Sierra University


Jean Porter's Ministers of the Law is a substantial book that weaves together insights from philosophy, the history of ideas, law, and theology. It is densely written, packed with detail, and attentive to a broad range of issues. While I am not finally supportive of Porter's project, I have no doubt that scholars from diverse disciplines will profit from engagement with this book.

Unlike proponents of the "new classical natural law" approach (Grisez, Finnis, et al.), Porter believes that a natural law theory can and must appeal to teleology and to a substantive conception of human nature to explain and justify moral norms. For Porter, there are "pre-rational norms which stem from the natural life of the creature" (100). Thus, "human nature itself is the ultimate principle of both customs and formal enactments, and of normative precepts and ideals more generally" (83).

Building on a theoretical approach defended in her earlier work, she suggests that political and legal obligation can be rooted in the natural law. Her view is not that natural law precepts can or should be translated directly into legal ones, but rather that the natural law, in effect, constrains the acceptable range of the requirements embodied in positive law. She simultaneously emphasizes (i) the contingency of human law and the gap between positive and natural law in tandem with (ii) the authority of law as emergent from the demands of human nature.

Porter contends that law offers those subject to it normative reasons for action, even though its roots in contingent human acts of lawmaking might seem to limit its normative force. Seeking to explain why law should be thought of as a source of obligation as well as a social fact, she examines its nature in conversation with the work of H. L. A. Hart, Ronald Dworkin, and Lon Fuller before suggesting that a version of natural law theory rooted in key mediæval insights can help to make sense of the authority she attributes to legal rules and systems.

The mediævals on whom Porter focuses were quite aware of the gap between natural law and positive law, and they did not maintain that positive law could or should be a straightforward rendering of natural law as positive law. We don't know the natural law perfectly and, in any case, it is reasonable to believe that it admits of multiple specifications. Thus, the mediævals articulated a view of human authorities -- ecclesial and political -- as free to create positive-law rules to respond to situational exigencies (so that natural and positive law were not coextensive) but as constrained (especially, but not exclusively) by natural law (49, 62-8).

For Porter, "political life and the rule of law are in themselves legitimate, valid, and worthy of respect, insofar as they serve natural purposes and express the intrinsic goodness of our created nature" (126). Authority serves to make people virtuous -- not in the sense that it may rightly seek to reshape their characters from top to bottom, "but by sustaining the fundamental structures of meaning without which the virtues could not emerge" (141). On Porter's view, political authority is justified because it serves the human good and because participation in public deliberation is itself an aspect of the human good.

Legal authority, in turn, derives from political authority, but is a particular sort of authority, designed not only to restrain and remedy evil but also to provide specificity to the requirements of the natural law and to coordinate and foster the pursuit of the human good in a given society. Porter elaborates an account of domestic law as playing a crucial role in securing various human goods but as constrained by a robustly conceived panoply of human rights, which are also increasingly embodied in international law. Porter believes that the model of law she has elaborated has applications at the international level and helps to explain both why it would be appropriate for domestic legal regimes to accept at least to some degree the authority of international law and why, at the same time, there might be procedural and substantive reasons to value the autonomy of particular societies.

Throughout Ministers of the Law, there are rich and provocative discussions of a great many topics -- the common good, the role of the judge, political rhetoric, freedom and paternalism, sex and marriage, the task of legal theory -- which certainly deserve further attention. But in the remainder of this review I want to focus on the core of Porter's case for legal and political authority detached from consent.

One thing that distinguishes legal rules from social norms or the bylaws of various sorts of associations is that conformity with legal rules may be secured using force. (In societies like ours, other rules may be enforced in this way, but only on the basis of the support provided by the law.) The use of force against people's bodies and their justly acquired possessions requires special -- and particularly demanding -- justification. An argument for legal authority is successful, I suggest, to the extent that it provides this sort of justification.

For Porter, "some kind of authoritative determination is necessary in every aspect of human life, precisely because the natural principles informing our existence under-determine the practical norms that give them expression." Authority is essential if people are to live good lives together because it "serves the fundamental natural purpose of determining or specifying the principles and reasons informing human action, in ways and contexts within which individuals cannot do so, or cannot effectively do so, either by themselves or through simple agreements" (132).

But it is reasonable to ask whether this is actually so to the extent that Porter maintains. That is, is it not at least worth wondering whether a combination of moral requirements, facts about the dynamics of the human situation, and agreements (whether simple or not) between persons could not, in fact, provide a stable groundwork for human interaction? Such a combination can be seen to offer a framework within which conflicts can be resolved without any appeal to nonconsensual authority.

Porter asserts that, without a concrete way of life, "men and women would not be able to function as rational creatures at all," and that such a way of life must be specified by a (reified) community. But of course this specification need not involve the enactment of mandates backed up by the use of force against the unconsenting, nor need its importance provide any general justification for the exercise of authority in a way that involves the use of force against the unconsenting. People need culture; they need law; they need habits, conventions, practices, and institutions. But it is not clear that any of these things needs to be grounded in nonconsensual authority relations. Culture need not be grounded in law (though law may help to sustain it). And as Porter observes, "systems of law [themselves] do not necessarily depend on the prior existence of a political regime, either practically or normatively" (295).

The question whether rational considerations (as, in Porter's framework, those related to human nature) rightly dispose one to accept another's authority in the first place is vital. But it is important to ask not only whether there are such considerations but whether those subject to a given authority have, in fact, embraced those considerations -- whether they have consented.

Porter endorses the view that consent cannot reasonably be expected to serve as a foundation for legal and political authority (38). But if persons are fundamentally equal from a moral standpoint, each with authority over her own life, if there is no natural right to rule, then it would seem that they are fundamentally equal in authority.[1] To treat them otherwise seems, at minimum, quite similar to treating them as slaves.[2] If one comes to have enforceable authority (as opposed to the voluntarily accepted authority of, say, a mentor) over another, this authority must arise through the consent of the person over whom the authority is exercised. Otherwise, it would not be true that people were, in fact, equally possessed of authority over their own lives.

Consent is not required to justify, say, using force to stop someone from engaging in violence against another. But the employment of force in this context is not an exercise of authority in the sense in which Porter is concerned with it, since it does not involve the creation of contingent normative reasons for the person being stopped, who would, ex hypothesi, be obligated to discontinue her acts of violence quite apart from any intervention by someone else.

Porter talks about the need for authority relations "to compel the wicked" (132); and it might be thought that the need to employ force against "the wicked" offers a clear counter-example to the claim that authority is just only if it rests on consent. But it is important to distinguish between two different sorts of compulsion. When I use force to repel an attacker or to recover what a thief has stolen, my doing so is not a function of any sort of authority relationship: rather, the attacker and the thief act unjustly, and in ending or remedying their injustice I am not holding them accountable to any sort of special, authoritative command, but only to the basic demands of morality. By contrast, when I compel someone to act in accordance with a rule that is not a moral requirement, my doing so needs some additional sort of justification. It is not clear that any justification for this sort of compulsion is available apart from actual consent. Actual consent does not appear to ground any extant political authority. And, given the ability of those with authority to use force against dissenters, it seems clear that the capacity freely to consent to their authority is limited or nonexistent: the threat of force vitiates consent.

In addition, the exercise of centralized political authority -- usually or always nonconsensual -- is predictably inferior to distributed, bottom-up alternatives because of the informational and incentival problems unavoidably confronted by actors with authority in centralized political systems.[3] Collective processes tend to ignore the particularity of the participants and to enforce one-size-fits-all solutions; distributed processes can be much more sensitive to particularity. By contrast, social order achieved through distributed decision-making features far fewer constraints on people's decisions to realize particular goods using available resources. The liberal ideal of social neutrality cannot, as Porter stresses (187-8), be fully realized under the umbrella of the state -- but that is an argument against the state, not one in favor of society-wide non-neutrality.

Nonconsensual authority is in principle unjust and likely to be ineffective and inefficient. It is also possible to note that systems of nonconsensual, enforceable authority are not only ineffective but also destructive -- inclined to award privileges to cronies, impair freedom, engage in destructive violence, and make war.[4]

In Ministers of the Law, Porter has contributed to a greater understanding of the moral, political, and theological commitments of mediæval natural law theorists. She has offered a useful model of careful theological engagement with the work of legal theorists and philosophers. And she has advanced a wide range of substantive claims regarding the justification of and limits on legal and political authority. The purported moral authority of states, understood as Weberian monopolists, and their legal systems is not, I believe, defensible.[5] But that does not change the fact that Porter's careful and detailed analysis is insightful and informative and that she is a stimulating and provocative conversation partner.

[1] I owe this way of putting the matter to Roderick Long.

[2] See, e.g., Stephen R. L. Clark, "Slaves and Citizens," The Political Animal: Biology, Ethics, and Politics (London: Routledge 1999) 23-39.

[3] See, e.g., Michael Taylor, The Possibility of Cooperation (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press 1987); Edward P. Stringham, ed., Anarchy, State, and Public Choice (Cheltenham: Elgar 2006).

[4] The "state monopoly on violence" (307) is both unnecessary to "secure general peace and restrain wrong-doers" and a source of destructive violence: states are by far the world's most lethal killers.

[5] See, e.g., Lysander Spooner, No Treason: The Constitution of No Authority; and, A Letter to Thomas F. Bayard (Larkspur, CO: Pine Tree 1966); Robert Paul Wolff, In Defense of Anarchism (New York: Harper 1970); Leslie Green, The Authority of the State (Oxford: Clarendon-Oxford University Press 1990); A. John Simmons, Moral Principles and Political Obligations (Princeton: Princeton University Press 1979); Gary Chartier, The Conscience of an Anarchist (Apple Valley, CA: Cobden 2011).