Mirror, Mirror: The Uses and Abuses of Self-Love

Placeholder book cover

Simon Blackburn, Mirror, Mirror: The Uses and Abuses of Self-Love, Princeton University Press, 2014, 209pp., $24.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780691161426.

Reviewed by Lorraine Besser-Jones, Middlebury College


In his latest book, Simon Blackburn explores the different shapes and angles that fall under the umbrella of self-love. The topics he covers include self-esteem, pride, amour-propre, and integrity, and his treatment of these topics is engaging. Writing in his usual witty style, Blackburn weaves together insights from Greek mythology, popular culture, literature, and the history of philosophy to develop a remarkably seamless discussion.

Over the course of the book, Blackburn presents a mitigated skepticism of the value of self-love. Self-love, he argues, is important when it is measured, and directed at one's genuine abilities, but self-love threatens to become over-bearing, particularly in a contemporary society dominated by greed. Running throughout his argument is a sustained critique of popular culture, and the result is a very accessible work that is likely to engage any educated reader, not just philosophers. His conclusions are not altogether surprising, but his ability to draw insights from such a wide variety of sources is admirable. To highlight just one example, in his discussion of respect, over the course of just a handful of pages, Blackburn moves from discussion of Kant, to G. E. Moore, to Christianity, to Aristotle. This approach makes for an enjoyable and accessible read, but with it comes a lack of rigor that might bother some philosophers.

Blackburn opens by paying homage to L'Oréal cosmetics, for inspiring him to think through the dimensions of self-love with their omnipresent advertising campaign dominated by the slogan, "Because you're worth it." What seems to captivate Blackburn most, though, is not the slogan but the facial expressions of the models in the campaign, which he holds up as illustrations of vanity and arrogance. He writes that while sometimes the models look "pleasantly human", they too frequently "project self-absorption, or arrogance and disdain" (44). The result is images of women who are "simply out of our reach. They do not care what we think of them. Like Narcissus, they appear to live in a world of their own, enclosed in their self-love" (44). Given that the slogan "because you're worth it" is expressed by such arrogant creatures, the upshot, according to Blackburn, is that the ad campaign serves to teach people that they are not worth it, but that perhaps they could become worth it were they to purchase cosmetics (57). And the dangerous upshot of this message is that it taps into our own vanities, for "Human beings only have to be told things to half-believe them, and our vanities are evidently always on a hair trigger" (51).

This analysis is apt and flows nicely with Blackburn's consequent critique of popular efforts to build self-esteem, efforts which too often focus on taking esteem in the wrong kinds of qualities, such as appearance, and end up producing arrogant individuals with inflated self-love. But it is worth considering what other analyses might also be apt. Surely someone working on the L'Oréal ad campaign sees the slogan as one meant to empower woman. In the context of a society where for far too long women were taught that they needed to work on their appearance solely for the sake of impressing the opposite sex, the notion that women could take care of themselves because they, alone, are worth it is an admirable one -- or at least is a move in the right direction. One wishes here, and throughout the book, that Blackburn's discussion were a little more sensitive to these kinds of societal dynamics. Doing so would seem to follow naturally from his view of the self, which he takes to be best conceived not as a static substance but as a process embracing one's experiences, the most important of which are "the relations it has to the social environment: the circle of those others whose takes on me so infuse my take on myself" (33). While I endorse this way of thinking about the self, I worry that it also makes some of Blackburn's criticisms too biting. For example, he writes that getting plastic surgery "dishonors ourselves, for we ought to think better of ourselves than that" (59). If the self is really so socially dependent and defined by the opinions of others, perhaps this judgment ought to be levied against society, rather than the individual.

Of course, society does come under fire at numerous points in the book. Of particular interest is Blackburn's discussion of the "self-esteem movement" of the late twentieth century. During this time, he argues, all flaws and failures were traced to low-self esteem. A child struggles in school, we say the cause is her lack of self-esteem. A teenager turns to drugs, we say the cause is her lack of self-esteem, and so on. Want to fix society? Work on building children's self-esteem. The problem with the self-esteem movement, according to Blackburn, is that it lacks empirical backing. He claims this is both because research on self-esteem is difficult (it relies on self-reports which may not track accurate estimations of one's self-esteem, and because self-esteem ought to be domain specific), and because what research there is shows that "the only reliable effect that it has is on a subject's reported happiness," which is "no more surprising than finding that self-confidence is a component of audacity" (81).

Is this a fair critique? Certainly it seems that the popularized self-esteem movements have not been effective; but is this really because self-esteem is not that important? Or could it rather be because the movements themselves were misguided? If we take a closer look into psychological research on self-esteem than Blackburn does, the latter seems a more compelling analysis. Perhaps the most salient finding is that it is not degrees of self-esteem that seem to matter, but the stability of self-esteem that matters to an individual's overall well-being (and not just her happiness). Influential research by Jennifer Crocker and colleagues, for instance, distinguishes between contingent self-esteem, which is based on qualities an individual develops because she thinks others will value them, and stable self-esteem, which is rooted in successful pursuit of goals that individuals value independently of what others think.[1] She finds that while contingent self-esteem delivers a fleeting, unstable sense of self that is associated with destructive behavioral patterns, stable self-esteem correlates with higher cognitive functioning, enhanced capacity for self-regulation, and other indicators of psychological well-being. This means that any self-esteem movement is likely to fail when its goal is producing high self-esteem in individuals, rather than teaching them to anchor their self-esteem in the qualities that will enable them to develop stable self-esteem.

Here, and in other areas, Blackburn's discussion would benefit from a more careful consideration of empirical research. He discusses psychological research in very broad strokes, and at times this can be misleading. We have seen how this happens with his discussion of self-esteem, and it happens also with his discussion of happiness. Blackburn writes that most people think that they would be happier were they to earn 15% more, yet this increase has no real long-term effect on happiness, as we quickly adapt to the extra 15%. What transpires, then, is that the "pursuit of happiness rapidly turns into the pursuit of wealth" (96), a pursuit that leads ultimately to a "treadmill of unhappiness and disappointment" (107). Now, some of what Blackburn says here is spot-on: we do all too easily adapt to changes, making it the case that very often even significant life changes do not have lasting impacts on our happiness. But the details count, too. It is now agreed that changes in income levels do make real contributions to one's level of happiness up until a certain point of saturation, which researchers estimate to be around $75,000.[2] For a large segment of our population, then, increases in income can help to improve people's happiness. Recognizing this dimension of the happiness research would only have strengthened Blackburn's consequent criticism of the increasing degrees of inequality plaguing the U.S. and other wealthy nations.

In the end, we are left faced with the same problem Rousseau struggles with in Emile. The self is relational, and defined largely through the opinions of others. Because it is so relational, we continually look outside of ourselves in an effort to develop self-love. But, especially in a society characterized by greed, self-love transforms into something comparative, and a healthy self-love ("proper pride in our own achievements" (187)) becomes elusive. Rousseau tries to solve this problem through educating oneself to be freed from comparisons, but Blackburn -- rightly, I think -- is skeptical that this is possible and is skeptical that getting rid of comparisons altogether is a good thing, for even proper pride involves some degree of comparisons. So how do we keep comparisons in check? Blackburn admits that we might not know, and in a very measured tone suggests that the important project may just be to bring awareness to the dimensions and pitfalls of self-love. And in this respect, Blackburn's project certainly succeeds.

[1] J. Crocker, “Contingencies of Self-worth: Implications for Self-regulation and Psychological Vulnerability,” Self and Identity 1, no. 2 (2002): 143–149; J. Crocker and L. E Park, “The Costly Pursuit of Self-Esteem.,” Psychological Bulletin 130, no. 3 (2004): 392–414.

[2] D Kahneman and A. Deaton, “High Income Improves Evaluation of Life but Not Emotional Well-being,” Proceedings of the National Academy of Sciences 107, no. 38 (September 21, 2010): 16489–16493.