Mirrors to One Another: Emotion and Value in Jane Austen and David Hume

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E. M. Dadlez, Mirrors to One Another: Emotion and Value in Jane Austen and David Hume, Wiley-Blackwell, 2009, 234pp., $89.95 (hbk), ISBN 9781405193481.

Reviewed by Alice MacLachlan, York University (Canada)



“The minds of men are mirrors to one another, not only because they reflect each other’s emotions, but also because those rays of passions, sentiments and opinions may be often reverberated, and may decay away by insensible degrees”. — Hume, Treatise 2.2.5

E. M. Dadlez invites us to consider how the works of Jane Austen and David Hume are ‘mirrors to one another’, not only because they reflect each other’s insights and perspectives on human nature, emotion and virtue, but also because — when the two are read together — those ethical, aesthetic, and epistemic perspectives reverberate to reveal new insights in each. Dadlez’s intention is not merely to present the reader with a Humean reading of Austen or an Austenian illustration of Hume, but further, to convince us that such readings are uniquely capable of explaining and revealing what is central to the vision of human psychology, ethics and society found in both.

Dadlez presents and defends several interconnected theses, which, taken together, guide her comparative analysis. First, she argues, not only do Austen and Hume consistently return to certain shared themes, such as the role of sympathy, the moral importance of happiness and pleasure, and the close connection between morality and emotion, but — when taken cumulatively — these thematic connections reveal a Humean bent to Austen that is unmatched by other philosophers (most notably, by Kant and even Aristotle). This shared affinity is unique, she claims, even if no single point of correspondence between Austen and Hume is. Austen’s Humean perspective also gives us more reason to think of her in the context of Enlightenment thinkers, and not the Romantics or Victorians — as is (apparently) sometimes presumed.

Furthermore, Dadlez claims, Hume and Austen are not just similar to one another: they are usefully similar. Austen’s novels function as thought experiments, demonstrating and illustrating Hume’s meta-ethical and normative claims; both her narrative content and her literary (clear, sparse, ironic) style make her novels ideal for this philosophical function in ways that few other works of fiction can boast. As a result, reading Austen with Hume in mind can draw out significant philosophical and ethical insights in Austen that are otherwise easily overlooked — she benefits from the association. But, finally, the advantage is reciprocal. Austen has arguably had more success than Hume in surviving the vagaries of history and fashion: she remains widely read and adored, and there is more evidence her works have ‘stood the test of time’. Thus, association with Austen can boost Hume, by suggesting that similar universality, relevance, and accessibility lurk in the pages of his philosophy.

Mirrors is divided into fourteen chapters, the vast majority of which are dedicated to independent points of comparison and overlap in Austen and Hume: for example, the complex relationship between pleasure, sentiment and virtue, as well as the role of sympathy and the general point of view. Key relationships get a chapter (friendship, love, marriage), as do certain emotions (pride, jealousy, envy, malice), and character traits (indolence, industry). Also noted are Hume’s and Austen’s respective attitudes toward ethical (the useful and the good) and aesthetic norms. In a sense, the book is composed primarily of smaller studies in Austen and Hume. These studies are for the most part satisfying to the Austen enthusiast and to the Humean, though there is perhaps more danger of selectivity on the latter side. At times, it might appear the Treatise has been mined for parts: Dadlez dwells considerably on Book II (Of the Passions) and Parts I and III of Book III (Of Morals), but there is little treatment of Book I (Of the Understanding), or of Part II of Book III. Marriage is the only contract discussed in any depth by Dadlez. This selectivity is perhaps understandable, since the scope of an Austen novel directs our attention to the personal and the passionate, leaving little room for discussions of property law, promises and contracts. Nevertheless, given Austen’s clear-sighted and realist attitude towards the constraints of class, economic status and gender, and her willingness to include differences of class and circumstance in her novels (consider Fanny Price’s precarious position in Mansfield Park or the role played by inheritance and entailment in the fortunes of the Bennett and the Dashwood sisters) a chapter on justice would have been appropriate.

Also noteworthy are the two introductory chapters, which provide a general discussion of the philosophical dimensions of literature. The first challenges and refines Martha Nussbaum’s well-known remarks on our engagement with literature as a way of doing ethics, and the second argues that we can look to the literary form of Austen’s novels, and not just their narrative content, for philosophical import. Dadlez argues convincingly, contra Nussbaum, that literature can provide morally sophisticated ‘Aha’ moments through clarity and simplicity, as in Austen, as well as through complexity and obscurity, as in Henry James. Her discussion of literary form is also artfully done: she draws on two different film adaptations of Persuasion to demonstrate how the more faithful reproduction (faithful, that is, to the structure of the novel) makes a far subtler, more delicate point about the constraints on women’s lives, the difference between deeply-felt love and sentiment run wild, and the courage involved in forgiving and restoring trust, than does the more obvious, explicitly romantic film.

Dadlez says explicitly that her argument is intended to be cumulative: that is, the text reveals the posited relationship between Hume and Austen gradually, through a series of smaller demonstrations as she moves from topic to topic. This makes her book an extremely pleasant read for an Austen aficionado — and, as noted in Dadlez’s opening remarks, it is a truth universally acknowledged that “any philosopher with an appreciation for moral perspicacity must harbor some weakness for the works of Jane Austen” (vii) — but the approach can leave the reader searching for closure, or for some sense of how Austen fits into the bigger picture of Hume scholarship and moral philosophy more generally. Those looking to understand Austen qua moral philosopher must rely on Chapter Three, which offers a critique of Kantian and Aristotelian readings of Austen, and the final chapter, which attempts to do exactly what its title says it will: namely, explain “What Hume’s Philosophy Contributes to Our Understanding of Austen’s Fiction; what Austen’s Fiction Contributes to Our Understanding of Hume’s Philosophy”. It is only here that Dadlez returns to the final of her original theses, namely, that situating Hume and Austen together enriches our experience and understanding of both. The reader is left with a sense of serendipity: Austen is not, as it turns out, a moral philosopher of Hume’s stature, but a coincidental combination of factors, “the enlightenment sensibility, the ironic detachment, the normative stances adopted,” nevertheless make her fiction the ideal location for Humean insight (214).

The most (and perhaps only) philosophically controversial claim Dadlez makes is the unique quality of Hume and Austen’s affinity: that is, Austen is more Humean than she is anything else. We may find traces of Kant in Austen, and broad swathes of Aristotle, but “neither one of these accounts for all or even most aspects of the ethical life that are clearly important in Austen’s depictions” (37). The argument against a Kantian Austen is very convincing: yes, there may be references to duty, to reason, and to steadiness of will over sentiment in Austen, but these have a pluralist, almost pragmatic quality to them, and they are balanced by an emphasis on the value of appropriate sentiment and of happiness and on evidence of how virtue benefits the doer. Austen and her readers applaud Elizabeth Bennett and Fanny Price when they choose their own happiness against what is presented as their duty.

The question of whether Austen is more Humean than Aristotelian (or vice versa) is more complex, and is never satisfactorily concluded. Many philosophers, most famously Gilbert Ryle and Alastair MacIntyre, have argued for an Aristotelian reading of Austen: in doing so, they draw on themes of moderation, the importance of habituation, the happiness that comes from practicing virtue with moderate resources, and the role granted to pleasure in the good life. Dadlez grants these Aristotelian elements in Austen, but argues that insofar as they are present in Austen, they are also present in Hume. Thus, they are not incompatible with Austen being more of a Humean than she is anything else, because there are, of course, many points of overlap in the ethics of Aristotle and Hume. Both ethics are roughly virtue-based, both focus on character as well as individual actions and principles, and both leave room for happiness and emotion. Further, Dadlez argues, Austen and Hume have much in common that goes beyond their mutual Aristotelianism.

I have several concerns with this argument. In the first place, Dadlez moves relatively quickly to dismiss Austen’s rather obvious ethical cognitivism as a potential problem for the Humean analysis. While both Austen and Hume accord power to the calm passions in regulating our emotions, Austen also insists that her virtuous characters subsume their sentiments to reason in a way that seems incompatible with it being a slave of the passions. Indeed, her wisest protagonists (Elinor Dashwood, Anne Eliot), their role models and their eventual partners exhibit something closer to the practical wisdom of an Aristotelian phronimos — at least by the end of the novels.

It might seem that one obvious point of connection for Austen and Hume not shared by Aristotle is their character utilitarianism; both emphasize how “virtues are the traits that make people useful”, where the ‘useful’ is understood as the ability to produce happiness and avoid misery (105). But overlooked here is a potentially gendered dimension to Austen’s emphasis on usefulness, if not Hume’s (questions of gender are not absent from Dadlez’s book as a whole — they are taken up in Chapter Ten, on marriage). Austen is a woman of relatively meager circumstances who did not marry, writing in a time when women of relatively meager circumstances who did not marry faced tremendous material pressure to make themselves useful — indeed, indispensable — to the brothers, nephews and various family members on whom they would depend. While the useful, as a particularly commendable form of virtue, is stressed throughout Austen’s novel, it is most often her female characters who are exhorted to be helpful. It may well be that Austen had utilitarianism thrust upon her.

Finally, I would have liked to see Dadlez acknowledge — in contrasting Humean and Aristotelian readings — the role played by Hume and Austen’s shared cultural and historical location. While there is no evidence that Austen read Hume, they are relative contemporaries, sharing certain aspects of British (English and Anglo-Scottish) culture, against which Aristotle must appear somewhat foreign. Given the advantage of shared cultural mores, an argument for the philosophical and ethical uniqueness of Austen’s affinity with Hume might have appeared stronger in contrast to his philosophical contemporaries, and these receive short shrift: Shaftesbury is mentioned, as is Smith, and, in discussing Shaftesbury, Dadlez mentions that she sees echoes from Butler in Austen, but this is never followed up (50). The lack of contrast with Smith is perhaps particularly surprising, since he strikes me as the strongest rival to Hume for the close affinity Dadlez describes. For example, she notes that Austen’s Emma comes to virtue through a habit of “self-command” (53). Furthermore, Austen’s account of sympathy often resembles Smith’s account more than it does Hume’s, particularly in its cognitive/imaginative dimension. In Austen, sympathy is a measure of moral approval as it is in Smith, rather than the inadvertent emotional contagion (which then becomes the basis of moral approbation) that Hume describes. As the Irish writer Colm Toibin notes in a recent film entitled The Divine Jane, Austen’s writing is appealing “because the idea of some people being worthy of our full sympathy and others not interested me greatly and still does”. Austen limits our sympathy in morally interesting ways that are perhaps more akin to Smith than Hume.

These concerns do not undermine the substance of Dadlez’s main claims or the richness of her discussion. Indeed, it could be said that the particular similarities between Austen and Hume are not duplicated by any other philosopher, even if there are (as I have suggested) affinities with Smith that are potentially equally fruitful for understanding the moral perspectives present in Austen’s fiction. And Dadlez has certainly provided the reader with much to savor on this front. In fact, I would suggest that someone looking for profound philosophical insight will not find it in the four main theses or their eventual defense, but rather in the individual comparisons and remarks scattered across the fourteen topics covered. Here Dadlez reveals herself to be a remarkably attentive reader of Austen’s texts and Hume’s. Indeed, that the book’s strength lies in the details and not the denouement suggests that it will be of particular value in interdisciplinary contexts: it has the double function of introducing Austen and her literature to philosophers, and Hume and his moral philosophy to students of literature. Given the rise of interdisciplinary humanities or ‘foundations’ teaching programs, it would seem that Dadlez’s text possesses those useful virtues of which both Hume and Austen would approve.