Modal Justification via Theories

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Bob Fischer, Modal Justification via Theories, Springer, 2017, 135pp., $89.99 (hbk), ISBN 9783319491264.

Reviewed by Stephen Biggs, Iowa State University


This book develops Bob Fischer's theory-based epistemology of modality (TEM), a significant contribution to the literature on modal epistemology. In addition to those working on modal epistemology, the book should interest many philosophers working in philosophy of science and metaphysics (since Fischer discusses the epistemology of both the physical and metaphysical modalities), as well as epistemologists working on inference to the best explanation or theoretical virtues (since Fischer discusses these in some detail, and quite insightfully, while explaining how we should choose among competing modal epistemologies). The book also could serve as a resource for those beginning to explore modal epistemology (since Fischer engages effectively, albeit often briefly, with many other contemporary modal epistemologies).

The book has two interrelated aims: to describe TEM, and to argue that we should accept it. What follows sketches and discusses Fischer's work towards these goals, taking them in turn.

Two preliminaries. First, Fischer offers TEM as an epistemology for "interesting" modal claims, which include both some claims about what's physically possible (for example, about "what's technologically possible, or what's possible according to our best scientific understanding of the world"), and any claim about "what's metaphysically [but not physically] possible" (p. 8). I suspect that the following is a good guide to interestingness, as Fischer sees it: if, even among those who accept that we can have modal knowledge, there's widespread disagreement about whether some modal claim is true, then that claim probably counts as interesting. Second, Fischer offers TEM as an epistemology for modal claims that hold "mind-independently", where a modal claim holds mind-independently (roughly and qualifications aside) if the entities that make the claim true aren't grounded in minds. Accordingly, when I talk about modal claims below, I am talking in particular about interesting modal claims that hold mind-independently, even though I henceforth eschew these qualifiers. Correspondingly, when I talk about TEM's competitors, I'm talking about modal epistemologies that promise to explain justified beliefs in interesting modal claims that hold mind-independently.

How can we justifiably believe modal claims? Fischer thinks that any justified belief in a modal claim stems from an antecedent justified belief in a theory "according to which" that claim is true. The idea is this: after we form justified beliefs in ordinary theories, we can extract "modal content" from them, and on that basis, justifiably believe modal claims. More carefully: for any modal claim M, one (non-derivatively) justifiably believes M if and only if (i) one justifiably believes a theory T "according to which" M, (ii) one believes M on the basis of T, and (iii) one has no defeaters for M. TEM, then, treats any (non-derivatively) justified belief in a modal claim as the conclusion of an argument (perhaps made implicitly) with this form:

(1) T [premise]
(2) T → M [premise]
(3) M [conclusion from 1-2]

Two notes. First, I say "perhaps made implicitly" because Fischer thinks that forming M on the basis of T doesn't require realizing that you're doing so. Second, on this formulation of Fischer's account, "T → M" should be read as "according to T, M", not as "T implies M". Fischer sometimes uses "implies" in this context -- see, for example, his case involving biology, dinosaur genes, and chicken eggs (p. 14). Most often, however, he uses versions of "according to". He defines "according to" for the semantic view of theories quite clearly (see p. 19-20), but leaves open what "according to" means for the syntactic view, a choice that reflects his preference for the semantic view (although he thinks that TEM can be combined with a syntactic view as well).

With this formulation in place, completing TEM requires explaining how we can justifiably believe the premises of such arguments -- that is, requires explaining both how we can justifiably believe relevant theories (which are those that have modal content), and how we can identify the modal content of those theories.

How can we justifiably believe relevant theories? Fischer initially invites one to adopt one's preferred account of theory confirmation. The invitation, however, is short-lived. Fischer argues that we can't justifiably believe or disbelieve many of the modal claims that philosophers advance, such as that expressed by "I could have been disembodied" -- for his central arguments for this limited modal skepticism, see his intriguing game analogy (p. 10-16), as well as Chapter 5. His arguments for this limited modal skepticism require both that familiar rationalist methods of theory confirmation (for example, rational insight) have no epistemic force (at least, vis-à-vis modal claims), and that non-rationalist methods of theory confirmation can't deliver justified beliefs in relevant claims. Accordingly, Fischer initially invites everyone to the party only to turn away both rationalists, such as Bonjour (1998) and Chalmers (2002), and those who think that ordinary scientific methods can justify beliefs in a quite extensive range of modal claims, such as Biggs (2011) and Biggs and Wilson (forthcoming).

Here, distinguishing the most general version of TEM from Fischer's preferred specification is helpful. I'll call the former "General-TEM" and the latter "Skeptical-TEM". General-TEM is open to any account of theory confirmation, and says nothing about how adopting any given account might constrain which modal claims we can justifiably believe. Skeptical-TEM restricts accounts of theory confirmation to those that Fischer sees as broadly empiricist (roughly, in holding that familiar methods of scientific theory confirmation are the only methods of theory confirmation that have epistemic force), and also holds that any broadly empiricist account of theory confirmation precludes forming justified beliefs in many of the interesting modal claims that philosophers advance.

Fischer foremost describes (and ultimately argues for) Skeptical-TEM, which he offers to a specific (albeit large) audience -- roughly, scientific realists who accept some broadly empiricist account of theory confirmation and are skeptical of the recent revival of rationalist metaphysics. General-TEM, nonetheless, remains available to a broader group. Fischer notes as much at various points, even suggesting that several prominent modal epistemologies are best understood as competing specifications of General-TEM -- since they suggest that any justified belief in any interesting modal claim stems from a justified belief in some specific background theory or principle (see p. 4, where Fischer discusses accounts from Lowe (2012), Hale (2013), Williamson (2007), Peacocke (1999), Hart (1988), and Kung (2010); and p. 25, where Fischer discusses Lewis's (1986) account). I emphasize this distinction because I think that many modal epistemologists would benefit from seriously considering General-TEM, even if they reject Fischer's preferred specification.

How can we identify the modal content of theories? Fischer explains how in two steps. First, he shows that ordinary scientific theories in fact have modal content. Second, he discusses how we can identify that content.

Fischer argues effectively that ordinary scientific theories have modal content according to both the semantic view of theories, which he prefers, and any plausible version of the syntactic view. He also offers a brief, compelling, general argument for the claim that ordinary theories (scientific or not) have modal content (see p. 21): theories are explanations; explanations imply counterfactuals, and so, have modal content; therefore, theories have modal content.

After showing that ordinary scientific theories have modal content, Fischer explains how we can identify that content. His account, perhaps surprisingly, appeals to the centerpieces of traditional modal epistemologies, viz., intuiting, conceiving, and imagining. Fischer sees an intuition that some claim could have been true as "an especially quick judgment to the effect that" a theory you accept either has a model that includes that claim or implies that it's possibly true (p. 25). "Conceiving and imagining", he suggests, do similar work, albeit "more slowly, more deliberately, and by way of more or less sensuous imagery" (p. 25). So, whereas intuiting, conceiving, and imagining are the centerpieces of many modal epistemologies, they are only part of the picture for Fischer.

At this point, Fischer makes a claim that, I think, is misleading. He says that, on his view, "conceiving, imagining, and intuiting" play important roles in the epistemology of modality", but are "downstream" from "the basic source of our justification", which is "the arguments that we give for our best theories" (p. 25). But if (iv) intuiting, conceiving, and imagining are "the means" for justifiably believing modal claim M on the basis of theory T, and (v) justifiably believing M requires believing M on the basis of T, then intuiting, conceiving, and imagining are part of the basic source of justification for belief in M -- the other part being whatever justifies belief in T (p. 25). Since Fischer asserts both (iv) and (v), he must accept that intuiting, conceiving, and imagining aren't merely derivative sources of justification for our beliefs in (at least some) modal claims.

Why, then, does Fischer say that these aren't part of "the basic source of our justification"? I suspect he's thinking along this line: on familiar appeals to intuiting, conceiving, and imagining, these directly connect us to mind-independent necessities and possibilities, which is implausible; on TEM, these only directly connect us to our beliefs (in theories). On this line of thinking, traditional modal epistemologies and TEM assign intuiting, conceiving, and imagining importantly different roles: TEM holds that these indirectly connect us to mind-independent entities (with the connection running through the justification for our beliefs in ordinary scientific theories) while tradition holds that these directly connect us to mind-independent entities. But this difference is orthogonal to the derivative versus basic distinction.

However we characterize this difference between TEM and tradition, Fischer thinks that the difference supports TEM over tradition. Why? On the one hand, TEM vindicates the familiar practice of discerning what's necessary and what's possible through intuiting, conceiving, and imagining -- and that's good. On the other hand, TEM does so without positing any mysterious, domain-specific connection between our minds and mind-independent reality -- and that's good, too. Although tradition matches TEM on the first score, it loses to TEM on the second.

This is an interesting, plausible assessment. But notice. An advocate of the traditional view could say that intuiting reveals the content of concepts, which are what directly connect us to the world -- indeed, this is more or less what many advocates of traditional views say. Given this version of tradition, we're comparing a view on which intuiting reveals the content of beliefs (in ordinary scientific theories) to a view on which intuiting reveals the content of concepts (of ordinary scientific entities). Does TEM retain its advantage over tradition understood in this way? Perhaps surprisingly, Fischer could safely say it doesn't, holding that concepts are theories, and so, tradition, understood this way, collapses to TEM. Alternatively, he could say that TEM retains its advantage because, among other possible reasons, broadly empiricist accounts of theory confirmation can explain justified beliefs in theories that have modal content, but broadly empiricist accounts of concept acquisition can't explain access to concepts that have modal content. There are many possible moves here, and any would need to be fleshed out.

We now can elaborate on the argument form that captures TEM:

(1) T [premise, justified however ordinary theories are justified]
(2) T → M [premise, justified by intuiting, conceiving, imagining, . . . ]
(3) M [conclusion from 1-2]

Should we accept that any justified belief in a modal claim is the conclusion of an argument with this form? Fischer argues that we should. His argument has two stages. First, he outlines a standard for choosing among competing modal epistemologies. Second, he shows that TEM fares well by that standard.

How should we choose among competing modal epistemologies? Fischer suggests that we should use inference to the best explanation, which requires treating competing modal epistemologies as competing explanatory hypotheses, and then choosing whichever earns "the best overall score" on various theoretical virtues (p. 73). The explananda at issue include "the distribution of justified and unjustified beliefs, the varying degrees of justification that our beliefs enjoy, why certain disagreements seem to be intractable, why certain apparent defeaters are only apparent, and so on" (p. 62). The virtues at issue include "simplicity, generality, conservativism, modesty, and predictive power" (p. 63).

Fischer is sensitive to familiar concerns about the kind of justification that inference to the best explanation and its underlying virtues confer. He pushes back against both the view that these confer pragmatic but not epistemic justification (since he thinks they aim at truth), and the view that they justify belief in the propositions they support (since he worries that they fail to connect us to truth in the way that, say, perception does). Rather, he thinks, inference to the best explanation and its underling virtues justify acceptance (on epistemic grounds) of whatever explanatory hypotheses they support, without justifying belief in those hypotheses.

How can a method justify accepting a theory on epistemic grounds without justifying believing it? Suppose that using a premise P in one's reasoning mostly leads one to true conclusions, regardless of P's truth-value (and even if one has no reason to believe P). One is then justified in accepting P on epistemic grounds, even though one isn't justified in believing P. At least, that's the idea.

Considering the virtue of simplicity, Fischer says,

By my lights, being the simplest hypothesis in a field of competitors is not evidence that the hypothesis is in fact true. So, I grant we shouldn't believe a hypothesis on the basis of its simplicity. Still, when choosing between competing hypotheses, we have every reason to prefer the simplest -- at least if ceteris is paribus -- because our aim of securing truth in the long run is better served thereby. I say the same of the other virtues. (p. 74)

How is our aim of securing truth better served by choosing the simplest hypothesis? Fischer suggests, among other considerations, that a preference for an otherwise equal complex hypothesis often results from a desire to save a "pet theory" from seemingly incompatible evidence. The idea is this: one who chooses a more complex theory over a simpler theory even though the two are otherwise equal probably is following a norm that leads us away from truth, such as preserve my current view come what may. Deploying a principle of simplicity, then, is a way to help us avoid following a norm that leads us away from truth.

I find Fischer's discussion of the virtues to be insightful and, on many points, compelling -- anyone who works on the theoretical virtues would do well to explore his fourth chapter.

But I'm suspicious of Fischer's caution about the kind of epistemic force at issue. Consider, first, the theoretical virtue of simplicity. If choosing a more complex theory over an otherwise equal simpler theory probably leads us astray, then simpler theories are more likely to be true (all other things being equal). And if simpler theories are more likely to be true (all other things being equal), then for any two otherwise equal theories, we are justified in assigning higher credence to whichever is simpler. Consider, next, the general idea that we sometimes have epistemic grounds for accepting a premise that we shouldn't believe. If I were to notice that using P as a premise in my reasoning mostly leads me to true conclusions (across a wide range of contexts), wouldn't I be able to generate an argument that would produce a justified belief in P (all else being equal)? The argument would proceed roughly as follows: using P as a premise in my reasoning mostly leads me to true conclusions; the best explanation for this fact (perhaps the only explanation that doesn't appeal to widespread chance or miracles) is that P is true; therefore, P is true. (Of course, this requires some bootstrapping.) Accordingly, even if I initially use P as a mere supposition, its payoff can help me justifiably believe it.

This isn't an objection to Fischer's account of how we should choose among competing modal epistemologies. Indeed, I think his account is largely successful -- both in that he argues effectively that we should choose among competing modal epistemologies by using inference to the best explanation, and in that he adds to our understanding of inference to the best explanation and the particular theoretical virtues he discusses. Rather than objecting to Fischer's account, I'm suggesting that a more ambitious account is still quite plausible -- a claim that Fischer may embrace, since his caution may reflect considerations of dialectical need rather than his preferred view.

How does TEM fare given this standard? Consider two virtues and one explanandum that Fischer explores -- although this captures only part of his answer.

First, TEM is inherently conservative because it would have us choose among competing modal claims entirely on the basis of what we already believe (specifically, the theories we believe). (Fischer sees the theoretical virtue of conservativism as a way to ensure that we don't ignore the evidence supporting claims that we already believe when we are faced with new evidence for some claim that's incompatible with what we already believe (p. 66).)

Second, TEM is inherently simple. Consider simplicity as a virtue that applies to grand theories of everything. Many traditional modal epistemologies complicate any grand theory of everything of which they are a part because they posit a domain-specific connection between minds and mind-independent modal reality -- and so, they add a new kind to the theory, rendering the grand theory of everything more complex than it otherwise would be. By contrast, TEM never complicates a grand theory of everything in this way because it only appeals to connections between minds and mind-independent reality that our grand theory of everything would require even if it didn't include a modal epistemology at all.

Third, TEM explains peer disagreement about modal claims quite nicely. Any interesting modal claim (that has been considered) has many advocates and many opponents. Accordingly, peer disagreement is an explanandum for modal epistemologies. According to TEM, if two peers disagree about the truth-value of modal claim M, then they likely have a substantive dispute about either background theory T or the conditional T à M. By contrast, traditional modal epistemologies struggle to account for substantive peer disagreement.

This argument for TEM is an argument for General-TEM. Fischer also offers multiple arguments for Skeptical-TEM in particular. One recurring argument proceeds roughly as follows: since we aren't justified in believing metaphysical theories that stray too far from the concerns of ordinary life, and we can't infer interesting claims about what's metaphysically necessary or possible from ordinary scientific theories (except insofar as they match claims about what's physically necessary and possible), TEM precludes justifiably believing many of the interesting modal claims that philosophers advance, such as that expressed by "I could have been disembodied". I can know that not having had coffee this morning is an accidental property of me, and that not having been had by me is an accidental property of coffee, but I can't know whether or not being embodied is an accidental property of me. Although Fischer hasn't moved me towards skepticism, I found his discussion of Skeptical-TEM, especially as it compares to Peter van Inwagen's skepticism, to be useful -- and, as I noted earlier, his game analogy provides an intriguing route to his limited modal skepticism.

As I said at the outset, this book makes an important contribution to the literature on modal epistemology, and makes valuable contributions to related areas in philosophy of science, metaphysics, and epistemology. I hope it finds the wide audience it deserves.


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