Modal Logic as Metaphysics

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Timothy Williamson, Modal Logic as Metaphysics, Oxford University Press, 2013, 464pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199552078.

Reviewed by Takashi Yagisawa, California State University, Northridge


Contemporary investigations of modality started as study of modal logic. Syntax and proof theory came first, and semantics and model theory followed. Then attempts at making philosophical sense of all that began in earnest. We now have a plethora of books and articles written on modal metaphysics. Williamson's new book is a very important addition to the literature on the subject.

Modal Logic as Metaphysics is aptly titled. Its main goal is to argue for a metaphysical claim, necessitism, by taking modal logic seriously. Necessitism says that necessarily everything is such that necessarily it is identical with something. In the possible-worlds framework, this means that for any possible world w, anything existing at w is such that for any possible world w' it is identical with something existing at w'. That is, anything that exists anywhere in logical space exists everywhere in logical space; every possible thing is a necessary thing. This is an extremely radical claim -- as radical as David Lewis's modal realism, perhaps even more so. Just as Lewis attempted to provide correspondingly strong arguments in favor of his radical thesis (Lewis 1986), Williamson attempts to give appropriately strong evidence for his radical claim. Lewis was clear, meticulous, and ingenious in his attempt. Williamson is equally clear, meticulous, and ingenious in his attempt, and just as convincing as Lewis was.

Williamson gives many arguments in support of necessitism. They are technical, sophisticated, and well worth struggling through. His arguments center around one common theme, namely, strong modal logic. Williamson wants metaphysics of modality to be science, and he thinks that formal methods separate science from pseudo-science. According to him, metaphysical issues concerning necessity, possibility, and related topics should be investigated by means of formal logic, and the best formal logic of modality, i.e., that which yields the most theoretical benefit at the least theoretical cost, is higher-order S5 with the classical rules of inference. Necessitism is part and parcel of this modal logic, and alternatives fare less well, he argues.

In particular, Williamson takes the simplest quantified modal logic, in which the Barcan Formula (BF) and its converse (CBF) are theorems, and endorses what he takes to be the most straightforward interpretation of these theorems, and that is necessitism. He gives a detailed history of the theorems, which is interesting reading by itself. Williamson spends a considerable amount of space arguing against alternative proposals concerning BF and CBF. He then touts the virtues of second-order modal logic and argues that necessitism is the best metaphysical stance to go with it. He also covers other topics, such as truthmakers -- he says that there are none -- but I shall confine my critical attention to the issues surrounding soundness of modal logic.

(BF) ∃xΦ → ∃xΦ

(CBF) ∃xΦ → ∃xΦ

Take classical first-order quantificational logic, add the sentential operator ("necessarily"), along with the necessitation rule of derivation ("Φ may be derived from Φ"), and you will have BF and CBF as theorems; is defined as ¬¬. To maintain soundness of this logic, we need to have BF and CBF valid. Within the Kripke semantics, the simplest way to do so is to have the domain function be constant, that is, to have one common set of objects to serve as the domain over which the quantifiers range for all possible worlds. Assuming that to exist at a given world is to belong to the domain for that world, this means that what exists at one world is exactly the same as what exists at another. Every possibile exists at every possible world. This is Williamson's master argument for necessitism in a nutshell.

An immediate objection comes to mind: Ordinary objects like you, me, this table and that chair actually exist but do not necessarily exist. You could have been nonexistent, for the egg and the sperm from which you actually originated might never have merged. This table could have been nonexistent, for the hunk of wood from which it actually originated might have been incinerated on its way to the factory. Assuming that actuality entails possibility, it follows that some possibilia are contingent existents, not necessary existents.

Williamson's response to such an objection is to undermine the reason for believing that ordinary objects do not exist necessarily. When we think of the counterfactual situation in which the hunk of wood was incinerated, we are certainly thinking of the possible situation in which the table is not concrete. But the table's not being concrete does not entail its nonexistence. That is, concreteness is not the table's essential property. If we claim not only that the table could exist non-concretely, but also that it exists necessarily, i.e., that the table is a contingently concrete necessary existent, then we will bolster strong modal logic. So we should make that claim.

How plausible is this response by Williamson? He believes that the issue concerns the relative weightiness between upholding strong modal logic and holding onto the common-sense opinion that ordinary concrete objects are essentially concrete, and that upholding strong modal logic carries more weight than honoring common sense; therefore, we should uphold strong modal logic at the expense of the common-sense opinion. Once we allow that concreteness is not the table's essential property, we have to go all the way to holding that the table exits at every possible world, rather than stopping half-way and holding that the table exists non-concretely at some worlds but not at others; the half-way position is unmotivated. So, the crucial question is whether we should maintain the common-sense opinion that concreteness is essential to the table. If we maintain it, we honor common sense at the expense of strong modal logic; and if we do not maintain it, we bolster strong modal logic at the expense of common sense. Or so Williamson assumes.

Williamson is hard set against common sense wherever the latter seems to contradict necessitism.

Multiplying entities is sometimes a necessity for the sake of theoretical plausibility, because the alternative is massive loss of simplicity, elegance, and economy in principles. . . . Granted, we cannot know pre-theoretically that there can be contingently non-concrete things, but our inability to know pre-theoretically that there can be things of a kind does not imply an ability to know per-theoretically that there cannot be things of that kind. It is not common sense that all objects are common-sense objects. However strange the consequences of necessitism . . . common sense has limited authority over such claims. We can properly evaluate them only by theoretical enquiry. (p. 9)

Defenders of common sense do not usually claim that we are able to know pre-theoretically that there cannot be contingently non-concrete things because that ability is implied by our inability to know pre-theoretically that there can be contingently non-concrete things. Also, even though it is not common sense that all objects are common-sense objects, it is common sense that tables and chairs are common-sense objects.

Bernard Linsky and Edward N. Zalta defend a thesis indistinguishable from necessitism by arguing (in a more limited way than Williamson) that it is the best way to preserve the simplest modal logic with BF and CBF as its theorems (Linsky and Zalta 1994), and yet are less hard set against common sense than Williamson. Linsky and Zalta say that ordinary objects are contingent objects, just as common sense says (Linsky and Zalta 1996). How can this be? If contingent objects are those that exist at some but not all worlds, then should Linsky and Zalta, as (theorists indistinguishable from) necessitists, not reject common sense? Well, their conception of a contingent object turns out to be different. They say explicitly that, for them, contingent objects are those objects that are concrete at some but not all worlds. Some might say that Linsky and Zalta simply redefine "contingent object" just to make (their position, which is indistinguishable from) necessitism agree with common sense and that this agreement is in letter only. That would probably be a fair assessment. But what is important is that Linsky and Zalta take the trouble of redefining "contingent object" in order to honor -- however superficially -- common sense. They think it worthwhile to respect common sense somehow. If they can find a way to respect not just the letter but also the spirit of common sense without sacrificing the simplest modal logic, they will probably take it.

Williamson does not even try to agree with the letter of common sense. He simply rejects common sense for the sake of "simplicity, elegance, and economy in principles" of a modal logico-metaphysical theory. But suppose that we find a position in which those theoretical virtues are preserved with less damage to common sense. Should Williamson not take up such a position instead of necessitism? The answer seems to be an obvious "Yes". But there is such a position: possibilism.

Williamson is aware of possibilism, of course. (Linsky and Zalta set up their project within actualism to start with, thus eliminating possibilism from their consideration.) Possibilism agrees with necessitism in using a single common universal domain, D, for all occurrences of the quantifiers in modal logic. So just like necessitism, it preserves the validity of BF and CBF. At the same time, it says that some objects are non-actual possible objects. Williamson explicitly rejects possibilism. His reason concerns actuality, one of the core notions needed for characterizing possibilism. He asks what actuality is and why it is contrasted with possibility rather than with possibility-cum-impossibility. These seemingly innocent rhetorical questions betray the radicalness of the conceptual framework Williamson has set up. He refuses to allow himself the notion of actuality. We would have thought that along with necessity and possibility, actuality was an important modal notion no modal theorist could do without. Yet, Williamson has apparently decided to do without it. Why? It is unclear (even though footnote 32 appears to give a clue). He says, "This book shows primarily how to reorient debate in the metaphysics of quantified modal logic around the necessitism-contingentism dispute" (p. 25). Such a reorientation is certainly useful, but why shun possibilism while discussing when it might support contingentism (which says that some things are contingent beings) -- thus respecting common sense -- and at the same time support strong modal logic -- thus delivering the theoretical goods Williamson touts as the virtues of necessitism?

But can possibilism really snatch common sense from the jaws of necessitism? Take NNE (necessary necessity of being), "∀x ∃y x=y", which is another theorem of strong modal logic with identity (p. 38). NNE is valid according to possibilism. But does NNE not say, as its name suggests, that necessarily everything necessarily exists? If so, possibilism implies necessitism. But of course, it does not. Under the possibilist reading of the quantifiers as ranging over D, NNE is true if and only if at every world, anything in D is such that, at every world, it is identical with something in D, i.e., anything in D at every world is identical with something in D at every world. Anything in logical space is identical with something in logical space. This is far from necessitism; the contingentist can easily accept it.

But if NNE does not say under possibilism that necessarily everything necessarily exists, what formula of modal logic does? At this point the possibilist could stay within modal logic by introducing an actuality operator, along with modal-scope indicating symbols like "↑" and "↓" (Prior and Fine 1977: 142-145, Forbes 1989: 23-42). But since she believes in non-actual possibilia existing at non-actual possible worlds, and already reads the quantifiers in modal logic as ranging over D, why should she refrain from quantifying over worlds and ascribing properties and relations to them whenever speaking of modal matters (and not just in meta-language, as Williamson does)? Doing so will make the discussion go smoother, for the language will be none other than that of classical quantificational theory without funny operators. The key possibilist move is to introduce an existence predicate that shifts its extension from world to world. (For simplicity's sake, w, v, and u will be used as world variables.)

(1) ∀w ∀x (Exw → ∀v Exv)

For every world w, for every x, if x exists at w, then for every world v, x exists at v.

Possibilism denies (1). The force of this kind of maneuver may be appreciated also in connection with the being constraint, which is the generalization of (2) and (3) to n-place predicates for all n and all interpretations of the predicates:

(2) ∀x (Fx → ∃z x=z)

Necessarily for every x, necessarily if x is anyway, then x is identical with something.

(3) ∀x ∀y (Rxy → (∃z x=z & ∃z y=z))

Necessarily for every x, necessarily for every y, necessarily if x is anyway to y, then x is identical with something and y is identical with something.

Williamson accepts the being constraint (sec. 4.1). Suppose that a particular knife blade B and a particular knife handle H were manufactured separately. If they had been put together, there would have been a particular knife K; but in fact they were not put together but were incinerated shortly after being manufactured. Pre-theoretically we are strongly inclined to say many true things about K: that it is nonexistent; that it could have existed; that it would have existed if B and H had been put together; that it is called "K". That is, K is a particular possibile that is nothing at all but that is many ways. Williamson rejects such an opinion (p. 149).

Unsurprisingly as before, (2) and (3) are valid under possibilism but do not say under possibilism what Williamson interprets them as saying. The possibilist will put the latter as (4) and (5) and deny both, thus upholding the pre-theoretical opinion above:

(4) ∀w ∀x (Exw → ∀v (Fxv → Exv))

For every world w, for every x, if x exists at w, then for every world v, if x is anyway at v, then x exists at v.

(5) ∀w ∀x ∀v ∀y ((Exw & Exv) → ∀u (Rxyu → (Exu & Eyu))

For every world w, for every x, for every world v, for every y, if x exists at w and y exists at v, then for every world u, if x is anyway to y at u, then x exists at u and y exists at u.

(One does not need to be a possibilist to reject (4) and (5). See the discussion on Noman and Nothan in Salmon 1987, which also contains an argument that a thing does not even have to be possible to be a certain way.)

Along with necessitism, Williamson also accepts permanentism, the temporal analog of necessitism. It is his position that defense of permanentism can be carried out à la his defense of necessitism, mutatis mutandis. According to permanentism, you, I, this table, and that chair exist now, existed at all times in the past and will exist at all times in the future. Many readers will find this position no less incredible than necessitism and may find the temporal analog of possibilism more congenial.

This tightly argued book contains a large number of interesting arguments, claims, observations, and comments on a wide variety of topics in modal logic and metaphysics. It reminds us that there is much useful philosophizing to be done beyond an incredulous stare.


Forbes, G. 1989. Languages of Possibility. Blackwell.

Lewis, D. 1986. On the Plurality of Worlds. Blackwell.

Linsky, B. and E. N. Zalta 1994. "In Defense of the Simplest Quantified Modal Logic". J. E . Tomberlin, ed. Philosophical Perspectives 8: Logic and Language. Ridgeview Publishing Company: 431-458.

Linsky, B. and E. N. Zalta 1996. "In Defense of the Contingently Nonconcrete". Philosophical Studies 84/2-3: 283-294.

Prior, A. N. and Fine, K. 1977. Worlds, Times and Selves. Duckworth.

Salmon, N. 1987. "Existence". J. E . Tomberlin, ed. Philosophical Perspectives 1: Metaphysics. Ridgeview Publishing Company: 49-108.