Modal Logic for Philosophers

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James W. Garson, Modal Logic for Philosophers, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 470pp., $34.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521682299.

Reviewed by JC Beall, University of Connecticut


Many philosophers recognize the importance of modal logic, broadly construed, in contemporary philosophical discourse. Beyond aletheic modalities (e.g., necessity, possibility), notions of tense, place, provability, propositional attitudes, and much more are often understood along "modal logic" lines, or at least along "intensional semantics" lines. While there are a few good modal logic textbooks already available, there's certainly room for more -- at least in the opinion of this reviewer.

Garson's textbook is a welcome addition to the current textbook options. In what follows, I briefly mention a few of the major virtues of the book, and then briefly turn to a few potential sins of omission.


Target Audience. The book is written by a philosopher and for philosophers. This isn't to suggest that the book glides over logical or mathematical topics; it doesn't. What the book does is provide the basics of philosophically relevant modal logics and corresponding semantics in a way that philosophers, regardless of mathematical background, will appreciate and understand. In particular, philosophical issues are raised throughout the book -- and, in my opinion, at the right places. While there are other modal logic textbooks that do a comparable job with respect to philosophical relevance, Garson's book is at least among the best.

Quantification. One can understand the basic, logical behavior of various modal notions by seeing their behavior at the propositional level. Still, philosophically interesting discourse often turns on quantification, and it behooves philosophers to understand the interaction between (standard) quantifiers and their given modal notion(s). Garson's book nicely covers (standard) quantifiers, nicely explaining both the philosophical and technical issues that are involved in various systems. In addition (and quite naturally), Garson's book equally addresses issues involving identity in modal (or, more broadly, intensional) languages and logics. Moreover, Garson includes two chapters relating to singular terms and their interaction with modal operators and standard quantifiers, a topic especially useful for analytic philosophy students (given Russell, Quine, etc.).

Logical Systems. Garson provides both natural deduction and tableaux systems for the target logics. The latter are naturally tied to diagrams, which are used throughout as an heuristic tool (a very useful tool, too). Garson nicely shows how to convert the given tableaux into "proofs" (where this is defined in terms of the given natural deduction systems).

Metatheory. If one's aim is to cover the adequacy of the given systems, Garson's book will serve that aim well. In particular, Garson covers the standard (Henkin-based, maximally consistent sets) approach to adequacy, but also provides a novel, diagram-based method for establishing completeness.


Many-valued. In many areas of contemporary philosophy (e.g., philosophy of language, epistemology, metaphysics), notions such as 'indeterminacy' and, to a lesser extent, 'overdeterminacy' play an active role. When such indeterminacy is supposed to be more than epistemic indeterminacy (i.e., ignorance of some fact), it is natural to model the phenomenon (or phenomena) along non-classical, many-valued lines. While adding modal operators to many-valued languages (and, correspondingly, logics) is straightforward in some cases, some challenges -- either logically or philosophically -- arise. Given the prevalence of such notions in contemporary philosophy, Garson's book would've been better had it canvassed modality in at least some of the standard many-valued languages and logics.

Non-normal Logics. Some of the so-called non-normal modal logics -- modal logics for which Necessitation fails -- might not be philosophically interesting in their own right. (Maybe.) On the other hand, semantics for such logics, originating with Kripke, are philosophically interesting -- and, at least by my lights, potentially useful across a wide variety of "modal" phenomena. (The sort of semantics that I have in mind are "jumpy" semantics, or "multiple-type world semantics", wherein one distinguishes different types of points in one's initial set W of points, and then, for some target connective, proceeds to give different "truth conditions" at the various "types" of points.) It would've been useful to have Garson discuss such logics, and perhaps especially basic semantics, in some detail.


This book will serve philosophy students very well in their attempt to learn at least standard (normal) modal logics. The book offers a useful balance between philosophical commentary and technical details. Except, perhaps, for the given sins of omission, the book covers the topics that philosophy students need from a modal logic textbook. At the very least, philosophy students who master Garson's textbook will be well-placed to explore other topics involving modality. This is exactly what one wants from a philosophically relevant introduction to modal logic.