Modality and Tense: Philosophical Papers

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Kit Fine, Modality and Tense: Philosophical Papers, Oxford University Press, 2005, 400pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 0199278717.

Reviewed by Thomas Crisp, Biola University


This is a collection of essays by Kit Fine, three of which are previously unpublished, on topics in the logic and metaphysics of modality and tense. Fine has been a leading figure in these areas since the 1970s. His work on modality and tense is powerful and original and has rightly been the focus of wide scholarly attention. It's a good thing that key pieces of this important body of work have been collected into a single volume.

The volume begins with an introduction by Fine to the general contours of his thought on modality and tense. This is an excellent little essay in its own right: we get a brief but clear overview of the big ideas animating his work on tense and modality and précis of the essays to follow.

At the heart of Fine's thinking about modality is his commitment to two theses: modalism, the view that there is an intelligible distinction (a) between what is necessarily and what is contingently the case, and (b) between an object's essential and accidental features; and actualism, the view that the actual is ontologically prior to the merely possible.

Part I of the volume includes two essays offering a detailed defense of modalism against Quine's objections to the intelligibility of de re modal discourse. There's also a previously unpublished essay ("Reference, Essence, and Identity"), originally written as a talk for the fabled "Themes from Kaplan" conference in the Spring of 1984, which argues that standard positions on de re modal discourse, transworld identification, and direct reference aren't as intimately connected as one might think, and contains nascent versions of themes developed in the two essays responding to Quine.

Part II comprises three essays on the following problem for actualism. On its face, talk of merely possible objects makes sense: one frequently hears talk, for instance, of the possible war between this or that nation; such talk often strikes one as true. How to make sense of such talk, though, if you're an actualist and eschew merely possible objects? Fine considers and rejects various versions of modal "ersatzism", on which talk of the merely possible is analyzed in terms of talk about ersatz surrogates. He proposes that quantification over the merely possible be treated as actualist quantification within the scope of a modal operator, so that to say that some possible object is G is to say something like: the actual world w is such that, possibly, some (actual) object x is such that, necessarily, if w is actual then x is G.

Part III comprises three essays on various metaphysical issues arising for the modal actualist and her tense-theoretic compeer, the presentist. In "The Varieties of Necessity", Fine argues that popular attempts to analyze natural and normative necessity in terms of metaphysical necessity fail. He proposes that there are three fundamental forms of necessity -- metaphysical, natural and normative -- none of which are analyzable in terms of the others.

In "Necessity and Non-Existence", previously unpublished, he distinguishes two ways for a proposition to be metaphysically necessary. A proposition may be a "worldly" necessity: true whatever the circumstances happen to be, but such that its truth depends on the circumstances, on how things turn out. Alternatively, a proposition may be a "transcendental" necessity: true regardless of the circumstances, true in such a way that its truth does not depend in any way on how things turn out. To illustrate, Fine thinks that the proposition expressed by "Socrates exists or does not exist" is a worldly necessity: it is necessarily true, but such that its being true depends on how things turn out -- in this case, on whether Socrates is among the world's constituents. He takes the proposition expressed by "Socrates is self-identical", on the other hand, to be transcendental: it is necessarily true, but its being true doesn't depend in any way on how things turn out. (I found this counterintuitive. Isn't that Socrates is self-identical such that its truth does depend on how things turn out? It depends, I should have thought, on whether something bears the identity relation to Socrates, which turns out to be the case in some worlds but not others.) Fine then argues that the worldly/transcendental distinction yields a nice solution to the puzzle of possible non-existence, which goes roughly like this: it is plausible that, necessarily, Socrates is a man, and that, possibly, Socrates does not exist; but these claims jointly entail that, possibly, Socrates is a man and does not exist, something quite implausible. Fine thinks the puzzle dissolves when you see that that Socrates is man is a transcendental necessity: necessarily true and such that its truth does not depend on how things turn out. Since that Socrates is a man does not depend for its truth on how things turn out, it does not depend for its truth on whether Socrates exists, and we see that it is not implausible at all to suppose that, possibly, Socrates is a man and does not exist. (Here too, I had a hard time getting into a frame of mind where I could hear this as true. That Socrates is a man strikes me as a paradigm case of something whose truth does depend on how things turn out: it depends, I should have thought, on whether something is identical with Socrates and has the property being a man, which turns out to be the case in some worlds but not others.)

In "Tense and Reality", previously unpublished, Fine deploys some earlier work on realism[1] in an investigation of what realism with respect to tense comes to. This is an important paper and will be widely discussed in years to come. As anyone familiar with contemporary philosophy of time will know, there is remarkably little agreement about what it means exactly to "take tense seriously", or in Fine's terms, to be a "realist" about tense. Fine provides a framework for distinguishing realism from anti-realism about tense. He then gives a version of McTaggart's famed paradox in terms of his framework. He thinks that, so framed, McTaggart's argument is more formidable than is typically realized, and that if the realist is to meet it, she must adopt a "non-standard" tense-theoretic realism, which turns out to be a radical departure from traditional realism about tense. Like the traditional realist, the non-standard realist thinks that reality is made up (at least partly) of irreducibly tensed facts, but unlike the traditional realist, she denies there is a privileged time to which the tensed facts comprising reality are oriented. There is not one NOW, but many, each equally real. This because, on her view, there is no single, coherent reality comprising the totality of tensed facts. Depending on her version of non-standard realism, she thinks either (a) that there are a multitude of realities, each somehow relative to or indexed to a particular time (or frame-time, perhaps), or (b) that there is a single reality alright, an über-reality, but that it is, in an important sense, incoherent: made up of incompatible tensed facts, facts like my currently standing and my currently sitting. Fine's central suggestion: if you're going to be a realist about tense, the lesson of McTaggart is that you'd better be a non-standard realist. More on this below.

To finish summarizing, though: Part IV of the volume, the final part, comprises reviews by Fine of Lewis's Counterfactuals and Plantinga's The Nature of Necessity.

I conclude with a few critical remarks about the non-standard realism "Tense and Reality" is recommending to tense-theoretic realists. As indicated above, it comes in two versions. On its so-called relativist construal, reality is irreducibly relative, in the following sense. (I shall join Fine in talking as if there are such things as facts and as if reality were "built up from" or "constituted by" them. I shall also join him in assuming that, at some cost in concision, such talk can be avoided.) Friends of fact ontologies have traditionally thought of the question whether a given fact belongs to reality as a yes-or-no affair. Either my being a philosopher, say, belongs to reality or it doesn't. Not so for the relativist: on her view, there's no absolute answer to the question whether my being a philosopher belongs to reality, whether it is among the constituents of reality. Belonging to reality, on her view, is an irreducibly time-indexed affair (or perhaps frame-time indexed, but let us ignore this complication): facts belong to reality at times, not simpliciter. Put differently, there is no single totality of all the facts -- no single reality; there are many totalities of facts, many realities, each indexed to a time.

Such is the relativistic non-standard realist's view. I am not sure I understand it. Suppose you were to claim that there is no fact of the matter about whether you belong to reality -- no fact of the matter about whether, quantifying unrestrictedly over the contents of reality, something is identical with you. But, say you, for any mountain M you pick (Mt. Everest, Mt. Whitney, it doesn't matter) there is a fact of the matter about whether, relative to M, you belong to reality -- a fact of the matter about whether, relative to M, quantifying unrestrictedly over what is real, something is identical with you. Interestingly, say you, relative to some mountains, you belong to reality whereas relative to others, you don't: relative to some mountains, quantifying unrestrictedly over the real, something is identical with you, but relative to others, not so. Were you to say such things, I should not understand you. For what is it to belong to reality "relative to a mountain"? What could it mean to claim that "relative to some mountains", quantifying unrestrictedly over the real, something is identical with you, whereas "relative to others", this is not so? I do not know; it is not easy to make sense of such talk.

Suppose now that we substitute talk of mountains here with talk of "times", and talk of something's being identical with you with talk of something's being identical with some fact or other. Is it clearer now what is being claimed? Not really. Indeed, if anything, things have gotten less clear: we have a decent enough grip on what mountains are, and what you are; we are much murkier, when it comes down to it, on what times and facts are. But Fine's relativist seems to be saying what is said in the previous paragraph modulo these substitutions. One could sensibly wonder, I think, whether such talk makes sense.

So far, the relativist's construal of non-standard realism. There is also the fragmentalist construal. Reality, on this view is "of a piece": one rather than many. But it is incoherent: made up of incompatible, irreducibly tensed facts like my currently sitting and my currently standing. So Fine:

One naturally assumes that in a correct account of reality all apparent contradictions will be ironed out. If something is both hot and cold, it must be because one part is hot and the other cold, or because it is hot and cold at different times, or because being hot is somehow compatible with being cold. But on the present view, this fundamental assumption is given up. It is taken to lie in the character of reality that certain apparently contradictory aspects of it cannot be explained away. Reality may be irredeemably incoherent (281).

For the fragmentalist, then, reality is irredeemably incoherent, but that's not to say she thinks there are true contradictions:

Although there is a sense in which the fragmentalist takes reality to be contradictory, her position should not be seen as an invitation to accept contradictions. Even if reality contains both the fact that I am sitting and the fact that I am standing, it will not be correct for me simultaneously to assert both that I am sitting and that I am standing (282).

Why not? Fine proposes that the non-standard realist will think of the semantic content of a tensed utterance as having two components, a factual and a focal component (296). The factual component is a tensed proposition that indicates the tensed conditions under which the utterance is true. The focal component specifies a time (or perhaps a coherent fragment of reality; Fine thinks the fragmentalist should eschew times), indicating the bit of reality relative to which the factual content is to be evaluated. So an utterance of 'I am standing' in my mouth at t has as its factual content the tensed proposition that I am standing, and as its focal content the time t (let us ignore for now reasons for deprecating times). The utterance is true iff the facts at t verify the tensed proposition that I am standing. We see now why no tensed utterance expressing a contradiction will ever come out true: an utterance in my mouth at t of, e.g., 'I am both sitting and standing' comes out true iff the facts at t verify that I am both sitting and standing. But for the fragmentalist, that can't happen: she thinks reality is made up of incompatible facts alright, but none that obtain at the same time. Fact incompatibility on her view, is, as we might put it, inter-time, never intra-time. The upshot: fragmentalists endorse an incoherent reality, but not one in which contradictions are correctly asserted.

Well and good. But suppose at t1, I am standing and truly utter 'I am standing'; at t2, I sit down. The factual content of my utterance is the tensed proposition that I am standing. That proposition is verified by facts at t1; wherefore my utterance is true. Since among the facts at t2 is my sitting, the facts at t2 do not verify that I am standing; indeed, they verify its denial, that I am not standing. Note the upshot: there are some facts that verify the proposition that I am standing and some facts that verify its denial. Since, one thinks, for a proposition to be "verified by the facts" is for it to be true, we seem to have that, for some proposition p, both p and its denial are true. Though the fragmentalist thinks no contradictory utterance true, she does seem to be committed to tensed propositions p such that p and not-p.

Of course, there are familiar stratagems for avoiding such commitment. Most obviously: deny that propositional truth is an all-or-nothing affair and plump for primitive truth-at-a-time, truth-at-a-fragment, or some such thing. But it'd be odd for the fragmentalist to take such a line: She thinks the world incoherent, populated by incompatible tensed facts like my sitting and my not sitting. Strange if she could stomach the coexistence of those, but not the coexistence of that I am sitting's being true, and that I am not sitting's being true. Why should coexistence of facts of the latter sort be any more objectionable than coexistence of facts of the former sort?

The fragmentalist's view of the world is a strange one. Reality is populated, on her view, by incompatible facts, and as best I can see, by propositions p such that p and not-p. This isn't easy to make sense of.

[1] "The Question of Realism," Philosophers' Imprint 1/1.