Modality: Metaphysics, Logic, and Epistemology

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Bob Hale and Aviv Hoffmann (eds.), Modality: Metaphysics, Logic, and Epistemology, Oxford University Press, 2010, 363pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199565818.

Reviewed by John P. Burgess, Princeton University


The Arché Institute at St Andrews conducted over the years 2003-05 a research project on the metaphysics and epistemology of modality, involving a series of workshops and seminars with a big follow-up conference in 2006. This volume collects what are identified as seven papers deriving from that research project and an equal number from the follow-up conference, with six of the latter shadowed by commentator's responses, and the whole ensemble framed by a substantial editorial introduction outlining the terrain of the project and placing the various papers within it or on its borders. The collection is divided into two parts, a longer on the metaphysics (and logic) and a shorter on the epistemology of modality, though the classification is in some cases a bit arbitrary. As with any proceedings volume, there is variation in the breadth and depth of the contributions, but on the whole the quality of the contributions is high, and one can be confident that several articles from the collection will be heavily cited in years to come.

Robert Stalnaker in 'Merely Possible Propositions' tries to juggle three ideas: (1) that possible worlds are propositions of some kind, (2) that the existence of a proposition is contingent on the existence of the things it is about, and (3) that contingency is a matter of being true for some possible worlds and false for others. His attempt to keep all three balls in the air involves distinguishing the notion of being true 'for' a possible world invoked in (3) from any notion of being true 'in' a possible world requiring the proposition to be present in the possible world in order to be true there. I do not myself see how he can have any room at all for the latter conception, given that for him so-called worlds are not really concrete worlds with things (whether people or propositions) in them. Aviv Hoffman (writing as commentator rather than editor) argues that Stalnaker has dropped a ball, committing himself to principles that imply that possible worlds are necessary existents, contrary to what is implied by (1) and (2) taken together. The whole discussion seems to me to show how much better it would be if people stopped speaking of possible worlds as if they believed in them while officially 'explaining away' such talk in other terms.

Ian Rumfitt in 'Logical Necessity' (the only conference paper unaccompanied by its 'response') sketches a notion of necessity he is pleased to call 'logical', though it is a less strict notion than truth by virtue of logical form alone, taking in, for instance, 'Everything red is colored'. He discusses at considerable length the relationship of the 'logically' necessary in his sense with the metaphysically necessary and with the a priori, touching on the problem of the necessary a posteriori and the alleged contingent a priori. Unfortunately, the discussion, which reaches a conclusion about the need for a certain distinction not entirely unlike Stalnaker's, depends heavily on the questionable notion of 'descriptive names' and so will not convince anyone as skeptical of that notion as the present reviewer; but even the skeptic will find many points of interest made along the way.

Kit Fine's contribution, 'Semantic Necessity', is really related only by analogy to modality, the ostensible topic of the volume under review: Fine argues for a view in semantics analogous to a view in metaphysics about modality for which he has famously argued elsewhere, namely, to his view that necessity is derivative from essence (much as theorems are derivative from axioms), rather than the reverse. Here he argues against truth-conditional semantics, among other approaches, claiming that truth conditions, among other things, are derivative from what he calls 'semantic requirements'. A secondary theme, which there is no space to pursue here, is that the notion of 'semantic requirement' itself needs to figure in the formulation of semantic requirements.

Timothy Williamson starts in 'Modal Logic within Counterfactual Logic' from the fact that in the formal logic of counterfactuals as usually developed, necessity and possibility do not have to be taken as additional primitives, since they are definable in terms of counterfactuals (in any of several ways, one equating 'it is necessary that p' with 'if it had been the case that p or not-p, it would have been the case that p'). He illustrates why he finds it philosophically illuminating to think of necessity and possibility as introduced in this way. Uncharacteristically for Williamson, no very contentious or paradoxical doctrines are advanced.

Daniel Efird in 'Is Timothy Williamson a Necessary Existent?' attacks a far more controversial view of Williamson's (one defended by him elsewhere, but not in this volume): that everything that exists does so necessarily. Williamson's argument for this claim depends on assumptions of the same kind that figure in Stalnaker's contribution, assumptions to the effect that the existence of propositions (even negative existentials) requires the existence of the things they are about. This is one of those cases where there is pretty widespread agreement that a certain argument is fallacious, but considerable disagreement over where the fallacy in it lies. Efird claims the argument for Williamson's conclusion can be blocked by making suitable distinctions not entirely unrelated to those urged by other authors in the volume.

Gideon Rosen in 'Metaphysical Dependence: Grounding and Reduction', argues that, just as according to Fine the notion of a property's being essential to an object cannot be adequately analyzed in terms of necessity, so also the notion of one fact depending on another cannot be adequately defined in terms of necessity (as supervenience, for instance, is often defined). The notion of metaphysical dependence must either be rejected or treated as a primitive. Rosen's main concern is to argue for the latter option, partly by illustrating the pervasiveness of the notion of dependence in the background of debates across philosophy, partly by showing that we have a good enough grasp on it to be able to formulate certain general principles about it and cite certain paradigmatic examples of it. For all that, one may still be left with doubts about the intelligibility of the question whether subjective qualitative experience, besides being apparently causally dependent on aspects of the structure and/or function of the nervous system, is also metaphysically dependent on them. But like Fine's paper, Rosen's is in large part programmatic, heralding an ambitious project going forward.

Ross Cameron, in 'On the Source of Necessity', addresses Simon Blackburn's dilemma: on the one hand, if an attempted explanation of the source of necessity rests on its being necessary that p, then there is still a residual, unexplained notion of necessity involved. On the other hand, if it rests on p, where p is contingent, then the necessity of the necessary becomes contingent, and necessity is not explained but undermined. Cameron dissects this argument in some detail, insisting on the distinction between the question why there are any necessities at all and the question why the particular things that are necessary are so, and arguing that some quite different views of the metaphysics of modality can escape Blackburn's dilemma in quite different ways. His own view is the incredulous-stare-inducing one that there exists independently of us a vast array of worlds (taken as abstract, not concrete entities), but it is our conventions that decide which of these count as possible worlds and which as impossible worlds.

Anna Sherrat also addresses the question of the source of modality in 'The Reality of Modality', focusing on criticism of Peter Menzies's identification of possibility with conceivability by an ideal conceiver. This idea she criticizes on the grounds that since actuality implies possibility, the Menzies proposal requires every actual truth to be ideally conceivable, which she takes to be implausible. She then claims that a wide range of 'anti-realist' views of modality face similar or related objections.

It is unclear to me why Scott Shalkowski's paper 'IBE, GMR, and Metaphysical Projects' has not been put in the 'Epistemology' section of the book, since it is directly and explicitly about an epistemological principle: inference to the best explanation (IBE), which was famously invoked by the late David Lewis in support of what is in the paper called 'genuine modal realism' (GMR), otherwise known as Ludovician polycosmology. Shalkowski aims to bring out disanalogies between the apparent use of something like IBE in science to justify hypotheses about unobservables posited to explain the behavior of observables, and the kind of application of IBE that Lewis and others have wanted to make in support of GMR and other metaphysical theses.

'Modal Commitments' by John Divers brings to the fore an extremely important but largely neglected question: of what use is 'modalizing' or speaking and thinking in terms of modal concepts and distinctions? Or as Divers puts it, what is the function of modal judgment? The answer may seem more or less obvious in the case of deontic or epistemic modalities, but the case that interests Divers is that of metaphysical modality. If we have settled that something is so, of what use is it to ask or to be told whether it had to be so or could have failed to be so? The first half of the paper, in which Divers argues against various facile, dismissive answers to his question seem to me, along with Daniel Nolan's perceptive response to Divers, among the most valuable pages in the volume. In the second half of the paper, Divers attempts to derive answers to substantial questions about modality from considerations about the function of modal judgment, applying a 'functional constraint', something like a principle that one should not posit more apparatus than is needed for identifiable functions. Here Nolan argues that the whole idea of a functional constraint is misguided, and one might add that any attempt to draw conclusions about anything else from premises about the function of modal judgment is premature, given how little we know about the latter.

Stephen Yablo's 'Permission and (So-Called Epistemic) Possibility' has two aims: first, to propose a solution to Lewis's 'Problem about Permission', and second, to argue that there is a close analogy between the deontic and the epistemic uses of 'must' and 'may'. (Efrid's commentary draws attention to some aspects of the interaction between deontic and epistemic.) There is not space to discuss the first aspect, which in any case takes us pretty far afield from the ostensible topic of the volume, in any detail: Yablo's proposed solution, which gets around counterexamples to more obvious proposals, is rather complicated, with four principles enunciated, of which a couple involve key terms ('free' and 'good') that are left unanalyzed. As for the second aspect of the paper, well-known difficulties about disjunction and other matters in deontic logic, reinforced by Lewis's discussion, seem to show pretty conclusively that the conventional treatment of 'you may bring it about that p', identifying it with 'it is not the case that you must not bring it about that p', does not agree with the use of 'may' in a deontic sense in ordinary language. Yablo argues pretty persuasively for a similar conclusion about 'may' in an epistemic sense. Note, however, that when it comes to the meanings of the modals in ordinary language, even the conventional treatment of 'must' in an epistemic sense fails to agree with its use in ordinary language, since in ordinary language 'She must be in her office' is in some sense notably weaker than 'She is in her office': Assertion of the former normally indicates a conclusion inferred indirectly (as from the lights being on), while assertion of the latter normally indicates a fact known by direct observation.

In 'Possible Worlds and the Necessary A Posteriori', Frank Jackson considers Kripkean examples of a posteriori necessities and the objection 'If S is offered as a candidate … how could we show that it is necessary, in the face of the fact that it takes investigation to show that S is true, and so, in some sense, S might have turned out to be false?' Experience show that this question strikes some as deeply puzzling, while 'might have turned out' strikes others as an obviously epistemic idiom, irrelevant to metaphysical modality. Jackson does not directly address the passages in Naming and Necessity and the 'Afterword' thereto in which Kripke goes into these issues, but rather advances his own answer that makes use of the apparatus of his brand of anti-Kripkean two-dimensionalism. Penelope Mackie in her response argues (convincingly to me) that the use of this apparatus is unnecessary.

In 'Apriorism about Modality' by Scott Sturgeon, the status of examples of necessary a posteriori is again the central issue. In his 'Afterword' Kripke hints that in all his basic examples it is analytic, hence a priori, that p is necessary if true and impossible if false, though it is a posteriori whether p is true or false. (Note, however, that from basic examples with this property one can construct compound examples without it. If p and q are independent Kripke-type necessary a posteriori examples, and r an ordinary contingent a posteriori statement, then for all we can know a priori, p ∨ (q & r) may be necessary or contingent or impossible.) The basic Kripke examples block any direct identification of the possible with the a priori consistent. Sturgeon argues that even a priori consistency given all basic Kripke-type examples cannot be identified with possibility. Unfortunately, his example presupposes that it is a contingent matter whether Ludovician polycosmology (called GMR above) is true. As C. S. Jenkins remarks in the response accompanying the paper, this is not a very plausible assumption.

Dominic Gregory's contribution is entitled 'Conceivability and Apparent Possibility', but there is surprisingly little overlap with the preceding item. Gregory is largely concerned with imagination and the extent to which it can make things seem possible. Suffice it to say here that Gregory raises a number of rather elusive issues about the phenomenology of imagination and what it does and does not present us with that will require further examination and discussion in the future. The response by Ross Cameron questions the relevance, though not the intrinsic interest, of all this phenomenology.

It can, I hope, be seen from the above summaries, brief and inadequate as they are, of the various papers how certain themes recur now here, now there in the volume, while at the same time almost every author takes up some topic that the others have neglected. If there are undeniably some rather tedious passages of logic-chopping in some of the papers, there are equally undeniably a number of new suggestions whose working out and evaluation should keep any number of philosophers busy for quite some time to come. I close with a cliché that in this case is quite seriously meant: no one with a serious interest in the subject can do without this volume.