Modelling Metaphysics: The Metaphysics of a Model

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Uwe Meixner, Modelling Metaphysics: The Metaphysics of a Model, Ontos, 2010, 274pp., €79.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783868380606.

Reviewed by Nino B. Cocchiarella, Indiana University



The content of this book, according to Uwe Meixner, “is a remote but telling simulation of the journey of a metaphysician around the totality of being” (p. 4). Meixner’s goal in this “journey” is a “systematic completeness in metaphysics,” a notion that seems important, especially in regard to completeness. Perhaps what Meixner means is that in his journey around the totality of being every ontological category is accounted for along with an explanation of how the entities in one category combine with those in other categories. Certainly, individuals (including tropes), universals and relations, states of affairs, and events are discussed, but how do we know when we have a complete account of all of the ontological categories? And how do we know when we have an adequate account of their different roles, which for Meixner involves in each case a kind of “compaction” (cf. p. 58f).

“Simulation metaphysics,” according to the author, “adopts … the perspective of complete transcendence,” something we cannot do with regard to the totality of being, because “we are immersed in that totality” (p. 7). Meixner’s simulation is done through the construction of a model, called Model T.

Many philosophers, Meixner acknowledges, assume that “there is no outside to Reality” (p.126). After all, how could there be an outside to Reality as the totality of being? But that view, Meixner notes, takes ‘Reality’ to stand for “everything — not as we know it, but in itself,” and therefore “Reality cannot have an outside” (p.127). “Reality as we know it,” as opposed to Reality in itself, could have an outside, according to Meixner, and Model T is designed to represent a “reasonable speculation about the facts of the outside to Reality” (ibid.).

Meixner’s argument against Reality as totality is somewhat confusing and I believe involves a fallacy in that he sees the term ‘Totality’ in the sense of Reality in itself as a singular term; and, according to Meixner, what should give us pause is “whether we can be sure that Totality ‘exists’ (in the sense of Free Logic)” (p. 128). In other words, we may deny that ‘the totality of absolutely everything’ actually denotes an object in the sense of free logic, or in symbols ¬(x)(Totality = x) might be true in free logic. Here we have a confusion of ‘Totality’ in the sense of everything understood quantificationally, as opposed to ‘Totality’ as a singular term purporting, but perhaps failing, to denote an object, i.e., a thing. It would be as if Wittgenstein were to conclude from his first proposition in the Tractatus that “the world is everything that is the case” that therefore the world “exists”, i.e., (x)(the World = x).

Meixner’s argument is that just as there is no universal set in standard set theory, so too we may deny that ‘Totality’ denotes. But of course that there is no universal set in set theory does not mean that we cannot quantify over all sets, and by that mean the totality of all sets, which in fact is just what we do in standard set theory. Similarly, that we can quantify over everything and speak of the totality of Reality — and understand by that totality that there is nothing “outside of” everything — does not mean that there is an object denoted by ‘everything’, or by ‘Totality’.

For Meixner, however, because we can deny that Totality exists (in the sense of free logic), “then whatever Reality system Σ we might consider, there is an outside to it,” and “Therefore: no Reality-system has the greatest purely objective right to be called ‘the Reality-system’ or simply ‘Reality’” (ibid.).

Model T is made up “two types of interrelated ingredients: positions and fillings” (p.9). There are, for example, 100 spatial positions forming the space of T (and arranged in a 10×10 grid of small squares with each represented by an ordered pair in the Cartesian product of {1, … ,10}). The spatial positions (squares) are either full (compacted with Fullness) or empty (compacted with Emptiness?), with Fullness and Emptiness being properties of spatial positions. There are also 100 temporal positions each represented by one of the numbers in {1, … ,100} and with the earlier-than relation represented by their numerical order. The result is, of course, a finite model with time serially ordered. Both space and time are discrete, and there are 2100 possible fillings of the temporal positions. That means that Model T has 2100^100 (or 210000) “complete histories,” with each history being T’s 2100 possible fillings of each of T’s 100 temporal positions (p. 10).

The spatial positions (squares) and the temporal positions of Model T are the basic atomic individuals of T, and that a spatial position has the property Fullness or is empty are the atomic momentary states of affairs of T. Composite configurations of spatial positions and of temporal positions are non-atomic, non-basic individuals of T (p. 20). A concrete continuant particle is a temporal sequence of full spatial positions, each next to, or above, or below, the next one in the temporal sequence. Such a continuant supervenes on the atomic individuals that make it up. There are also composite momentary states of affairs as well, made of conjunctions of atomic states of affairs, and some among them will be maximally composite momentary states of T. Does this mean that the logical operation of conjunction is a constituent of states of affairs, i.e., that in some sense conjunction (and also disjunction and negation) is part of the physical makeup of the worlds of T? This is an issue neither noted nor commented on by Meixner. Some philosophers would prefer to speak of these conjunctions (and disjunctions, etc.) as propositions instead, or given the finiteness of T, just sentences. (Consider the Tractatus again, where there are no composite states of affairs even though one can speak of the totality of all atomic states of affairs.)

There is also a “now” operator and future and past operators as well, according to Meixner. A state of affairs that is now the case is assumed to be different from that state of affairs simply being the case (p. 43), but what it is about the “now” state of affairs that makes it different from the other is not explained. Again, some philosophers would prefer to speak of tensed propositions instead of “time-thematic” states of affairs, and once quantifiers are introduced one can show that there is a difference between now-being-the-case and being-the-case simpliciter. In any case, Meixner assumes that “there is an objective justification for assuming that some — in fact, every — temporal position of T once (but not at the temporal position itself [sic]) deserves the designation ‘the present moment’ more than any other temporal position of T — an objective justification that comes from outside of T” (p. 46). This is a difficult view to understand, but Meixner goes further in maintaining that there is “a unified T-extrinsic perspective on the direction of time (i.e., past and future), presentness, and actuality” (ibid.).

Meixner’s view of actuality (or really actuality* and actuality**) is one of the most difficult notions to understand in this book. A history H is said to be “a candidate for being actual if and only if H intrinsically implies the totality of laws,” where a law is a regularity. Only regularities, no fundamental forces, powers, capacities, etc. are involved in Meixner’s view of laws as “states of affairs that are intrinsically implied by every history that is a candidate for being actual” (p. 72). Why the laws of nature could not be different in any history that is “a candidate for being actual” is not explained but taken by Meixner as what it is to be a law “in the primary sense” (ibid.). “If all T-histories are candidates for being actual,” according to Meixner, “then the T-laws are precisely the states of affairs that are intrinsically implied by all T-histories” (ibid.). Why there cannot be equivalence classes of T-histories that have the same T-laws — i.e., in which regularities are invariant only in the members of the same equivalence class — is not considered at all by Meixner. In any case the objectivity of laws of nature, according to Meixner, “must find their ontological justification outside of T” (p. 75). “And the analogy between model and original … suggests that the ontological justification of the corresponding aspects of Reality — taken to be objective — must, analogously, come from the outside of Reality” (ibid.).

To speak of a history H as actual, or of a temporal position as present (now), is to make an overtly indexical statement, which as such is implicitly relativized. But there are also the notions of actuality* and presentness*, according to Meixner, which can be used without any implicit relativization; and if saying that a history is actual*, or that a temporal position is present*, is to be “understood objectively, then something that affects T from the outside is necessary for determining their truth or falsity” (p. 82). Meixner agrees that “many philosophers feel unable to make sense of the real-life analogues” of statements about actuality* and presentness* (ibid.), and this reviewer must admit to being one of those many.

The difficulty in understanding actuality* is compounded by a further notion, actuality**, which also involves no relativization to temporal positions or histories (p. 92). Either both actuality* and actuality** “capture nothing objective about T — or both … apply truly or falsely in virtue of objectively given aspects which are extrinsic to T, come from outside T,” the option that is taken by Meixner (p. 92f). Actuality** is taken to entail presentness*, and presentness* to entail actuality**. In fact, presentness* is taken to be actuality** (p.93). “The primary potential recipients of actuality** are the maximal momentary events” of a T-history (p. 95), where a maximal momentary event assigns a maximal composite state to a single temporal position. (Events in general are functions from non-empty sets of temporal positions to momentary states of affairs.)

Along with actuality** there is also the fingertip, Δ**, of actuality** (or presentness*). We are to imagine “the tip of a finger going from one little square to another in the rectangle that comprises, as little squares, all the maximal momentary events (of T), never touching more than one square at a time and never touching a square twice over” (p. 96). The idea is that “the maximal momentary event that is touched by the fingertip becomes actual** (present*), and ceases to be actual** (present*) as soon as it is no longer touched by it” (ibid.). The consecutive touching of Δ** is supposed to “actually bring about a process of actuality**,” and in this way it “provides the timeline of T with a uniform, non-stipulatory, objective [flow and] direction,” thereby giving both the past and future as well as the earlier-than relation “an objective justification” (p. 97).

In terms of the fingertip of actuality** and a number of rules for how it is to be moved, Meixner describes what he calls “the game of Actualization* of a history”, or ACTUHIST. One can consider different players of the game. For example, one might be “a sole and entirely unintelligible player: a chance-generator, Mr Chance” (p. 105), and, as Meixner notes, “many philosophers choose to believe that the actual world of Reality is, ultimately, just this: a mere product of genuine chance and/or inscrutable necessity” (p. 265). To be sure, "the correct Weltanshauung for Model T," according to Meixner, is physicalism (p. 213). Meixner himself is a dualist, however, which is not incompatible with physicalism. At one point Meixner describes the game ACTUHIST with four players in addition to the author, the players being analogous to the souls of certain material objects. A number of other analogies between the metaphysics of Model T and the metaphysics of Reality are made throughout the book as well, especially in a final chapter.

Modal notions for non-time-dependent states of affairs are also discussed. Such a state of affairs said to be possible*, for example, if it is “intrinsically implied” by (i.e., holds in) some T-history that is a candidate for being actual, and it is necessary* if it is intrinsically implied by every T-history that is a candidate for being actual. But the ontological adequacy of these notions is challenged, because, according to Meixner, necessity* “does not guarantee that whatever is necessary* is actual*” (p. 111), which is what would happen if ACTUHIST was never in fact played. A number of modifications in the definitions are then proposed along with another notion of actuality, namely actuality***, which is “a T-immanent concept of actuality” (p. 117).

This is a book filled with many definitions and metaphysical distinctions in terms of Model T. Some of the notions cannot be understood except through a transcendental perspective. Philosophers who are not used to such a perspective will not find it easy to follow all of the details in this book.