Models of the History of Philosophy, Vol. III: The Second Enlightenment and the Kantian Age

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Gregorio Piaia and Giovanni Santinello (eds.), Models of the History of Philosophy, Vol. III: The Second Enlightenment and the Kantian Age, Springer, 2015, 964pp., $349.00 (hbk), ISBN 9789401799652.

Reviewed by Mogens Lærke, CNRS, ENS de Lyon


This is the third of five planned volumes on the 'models of the history of philosophy' edited by Gregorio Piaia and Giovanni Santinello (†). Apart from the editors, six other scholars have contributed (Italo Francesco Baldo, Francesco Bottin, Giuseppe Micheli, Ilario Tolomio, Mario Longo, and Anna Fabriziani). Reviewing the third volume without providing an idea of the material included in the preceding two is practically impossible, so I shall begin with a brief description of the project as a whole and a very brief summary of the three volumes published until now.

The series is essentially an English translation of a work in Italian published over a period of some 25 years, from 1979 to 2004, the Storia delle storie generali della filosofia (seven books in five volumes), but the English edition has been updated and includes in particular a wealth of new bibliographical material. The aim of the project is to write a history of the 'general' histories of philosophy, that is to say, a history that focuses (mostly) on the way in which, historically, intellectuals have engaged with philosophy's past taken as a whole, how they have organized it into sects, schools, systems, epochs and so on. The first volume of the English translation, published in 1993, covers roughly the period from 1500-1650, from Pico della Mirandola, Montaigne via Pierre Gassendi, Thomas Stanley, Justus Lipsius and Adriaan Heerebord to Jacob Thomasius, just to mention some of the better-known figures (Piaia and Santinello 1993). The second volume, concerned with the period from the Cartesian age to Johann Jakob Brucker, approximately from 1630 to 1750, appeared in 2013. Among the authors treated here we find, for example, Jean-Baptiste Du Hamel, René Rapin, Pierre Coste, Pierre Bayle, Pierre-Daniel Huet, André-François Boureau-Deslandes, Christian Thomasius, Johann Franz Budde, Christoph August Heumann and, of course, Brucker (Piaia and Santinello 2013). The new third volume studies the period from around 1750 to 1850, from the high Enlightenment to the Kantian histories of philosophy, where we encounter well-known figures like Diderot and d'Alembert, Condillac and Condorcet, but also Adam Smith and Dugald Stewart, and, in Germany, post-Kantian historians such as Wilhelm Gottlieb Tennemann and Ernst Christian Gottlieb Reinhold.

A word should first be said about the title, both the original Italian and the English. First, in both cases, what is meant by the expression 'history of philosophy' is of course not the history itself but the discipline, or what is more properly called the 'historiography of philosophy'. What the volumes provide is thus an account of the forms the historiography of philosophy has taken from the Renaissance to the 19th century. Next, we note that there is a slight difference between the original Italian and the English title: the latter speaks not of 'general histories' but of 'models'. None of the introductory material in three volumes provides an explanation for the change. I shall return below to this notion of 'models' that, on a deeper level of analysis, I find quite astute. It should however be noted that, on a more superficial level, it is slightly misleading. This is mainly because the editors do not, in fact, organize the history of the historiography of philosophy according to different 'models'. Rather, they organize it into a series of individual figures or groups, bundled together in parts that are largely organized according to a double criterion of chronology and nationality, e.g. "The Historiography of Philosophy in Italy in the Second half of the Eighteenth Century" (vol. III, part II) or "The Historiography of Philosophy in Germany in the Late Enlightenment" (vol. III, part IV).

Accordingly, each section is dedicated to a single figure or group and structured following a complex organization of subsections, beginning with biographical and bibliographical data, a presentation of the author's 'concept' of the history of philosophy, his approach to periodization and the historiographical theories expounded in his work and, finally, the methodological choices made. Each entry concludes with some remarks on the reception of the author and a bibliography of the secondary literature available. In this list of topics, a section on the cultural and institutional circumstances under which the various historiographical models were elaborated is curiously absent. In an insightful review of vol. II, Leo Catana has in this context complained that Piaia and Santinello do not engage sufficiently with the historical circumstances but largely limit themselves to the intellectual context, accounting only for influences from previous histories of philosophy or then-current philosophical schools (Catana 2012). The critique is not entirely unjustified and there is further work to be done here. On this point, the remarkable studies by Ulrich Schneider on the university context of German historiography of philosophy in 19th century historiography could provide a model for further study into the institutional settings of the discipline in the past (Schneider 1990, 1998).

Above, in my brief summaries of the contents, I have highlighted only figures that one can reasonably think would ring some bells even for historians of philosophy who do not specialize in the history of their own discipline. This does however overshadow a very important aspect of these volumes. If we put to one side the lengthy entry in vol. III dedicated to the 'Kantian Turning-Point', it is an underlying criterion of the entire project that the space and attention granted to some figure is proportional not to what that figure contributed to philosophy -- and which is exactly what makes most of them familiar to the majority of historians of philosophy -- but what they contributed to the historiography of philosophy. Hence, for example, Alexandre Savérien and Charles Batteux are given as much attention as Condillac and Condorcet, and William Enfield is studied on a par with Adam Smith. Moreover, what counts is how a figure's contribution was perceived in his own time and not how we perceive that contribution today. Johann Jacob Brucker, for example, is often forgotten nowadays, but his Historia critica philosophiae (1741-1767) played a monumental role in defining the historiography of philosophy as the study of philosophical systems. It largely determined how, for example, a famous philosopher like Denis Diderot approached the field. In contrast, Diderot, for his part, made little independent contribution to the historiography of philosophy. Accordingly, in vol. II, Brucker is granted more than a 100 pages of commentary while the study of Diderot in vol. III takes up only three.

Consistent application of this symmetry principle -- to borrow David Bloor's expression from the sociology of scientific knowledge -- lends exceptional historical balance to Piaia and Santinello's work. It also implies, however, that the vast majority of the works they describe were written by people who were indisputably unimportant as philosophers. Indeed, their volumes are mostly populated by illustres inconnus. How many professional historians of philosophy can honestly say they have ever heard of Ericus Gislonis Spinerus Smolandus, Claude Guillermet Bérigard, Edmond Pourchot, Adrian Lamezan, Appiano Buonafede or Karl Adolph Cësar? Chances are I just sent most readers of this review searching on Wikipedia. But mostly in vain, I am sure, since in many cases the only place one will find serious information about these obscure people is in the volumes by Piaia and Santinello. This antiquarian aspect of their work does however prompt an obvious question from the present-day historian of philosophy (not mention the present-day philosopher): Why should she even care about these long-forgotten predecessors that they have dug up from philosophy's past? Do Piaia and Santinello provide an answer to that question? And if not, can we offer an answer on their behalf?

Let us first consider the explicit purpose of the project. When it was first conceived by Giovanni Santinello in the late 1970s, the project of writing a history of the 'general histories of philosophy' was motivated by what the general editor of the English edition, Constance W.T Blackwell, in her foreword to the first volume, calls an 'anti-idealist impulse', in the tradition of Émile Bréhier's anti-Hegelian Histoire de la philosophie from 1926. The objective was, as Blackwell puts it, not to "impose an 'idea' on the historical text, as post-Kantian philosophers had done, but . . . examine the texts themselves" (Piaia and Santinello 1993: xiv). It is unclear that this is a lesson that we need to be taught today -- especially in the English-speaking world where the idealist tradition was never very strong in the first place. Today, almost a century after Bréhier's Histoire, neo-Kantian or Hegelian a priori accounts of the history of philosophy have become very rare indeed. The general lesson we can learn from Piaia's and Santinello's detailed text-based research -- putting to one side the enormous wealth of historical and textual data it affords us -- is, I think, different from the one originally intended. It concerns how we should asses the philosophical value of the historiography of philosophy as it is practiced in our own departments.

Nowadays, the importance and relevance of the historiography of philosophy as an intellectual enterprise is most often discussed by reference to the academic discipline the history of which it is concerned with, i.e. by reference to philosophy itself. Now, this is understandable enough given that historians of philosophy tend to walk the corridors of philosophy departments rather than history departments. It seems a legitimate question to ask what exactly those faculty members contribute to the topic their department is dedicated to. On the other hand, it also seems importantly wrong to ask a historian of philosophy to contribute to the philosophy he is writing the history of, just as it seems unreasonable to require of a war historian to engage in combat or an art historian to take up painting. So what can the historian of philosophy contribute to the life of his department? What, if anything, is properly philosophical about the work she produces?

The vast majority of methodological texts published in English over the last decades circle around that question. It is already the case in Rorty, Schneewind and Skinner's influential 1984 volume on Philosophy in History, in Peter Hare's 1988 volume Doing Philosophy Historically, and Rogers and Sorell's 2005 volume on Analytic Philosophy and History of Philosophy, just to mention a few of the highlights. Recently, in 2013, Eric Schliesser, Justin Smith and myself edited a volume, Philosophy and Its History, equally concerned with methodological issues in early modern philosophy. These volumes, however, only represent a fragment of the publications on the topic produced over the last three decades. Having spent a few years now familiarizing myself with the impressive body of methodological literature available, I, for one, am not quite sure how much more can possibly be said on the topic of the relations between philosophy and the history of philosophy without a major change in the way we approach it.

At the risk of being rightfully accused of excessive simplification, let me summarize the lay of the land as I see it. Among more analytically oriented historians of philosophy in the Anglo-American tradition, the debates have been going something like this: some argue -- this is dubbed the "collegial approach" by Jonathan Bennett -- that present-day historians of philosophy should stand as judge over the history of philosophy, separating the wheat from the chaff, choosing the 'arguments' from which we can 'learn' and discard the "rubbish which causes other people to write rubbish," to quote Bennett's memorable (but outrageous) quip about part V of Spinoza's Ethics (Bennett 1984: 374; Bennett 2001). While this was a very popular approach some decades ago, there are today considerably fewer historians of philosophy who would subscribe to such manhandling of past philosophers without some kind of principled restraint. Others, of the same generation as Bennett but of a milder disposition, argue instead that one should read the texts 'charitably', always searching out the better, more reasonable interpretation since, as another prominent Spinoza scholar, Edwin Curley, puts it, "views that are tremendously implausible should not be attributed to the great, dead philosophers without pretty strong textual evidence" (Curley and Walski 1999: 242). A third, currently fashionable, position in this debate takes the contrary view and stresses how we should not 'domesticate' (Melamed 2013) or 'tame' (Della Rocca 2013) past philosophers, forcing their thoughts into our conceptual categories, or "not take the weirdness out of them" as the prominent medieval scholar Marilyn McCord Adams put it somewhat colloquially at a recent event at Princeton (May 2016) where such issues were discussed.

On the more historically oriented side of the debates, effort has put into accounting for what essential difference the pastness of past philosophy makes for its philosophical significance. Some, Daniel Garber and Michael Ayers probably being the most prominent examples, have argued in favor of an unapologetically antiquarian approach to philosophy's past, stressing the importance of exact historical understanding above contemporary relevance and the separation in principle between the reconstruction of historical meaning and the search for philosophical truth (Garber and Ayers 1998). And yet, at the same time, Garber in particular has also insisted on some indirect, but still significant philosophical relevance of history to the extent that past philosophy is like a 'foreign land' from where we can observe our own intellectual enterprises as from afar, providing some new perspectives on ourselves (Garber 1988). Others, equally attached to the historical study of past philosophy but looking for a less allusive account of the philosophical uses of it, have stressed the very unclear boundaries between past and present and the historical situation of any philosophical enterprise, however contemporary or ahistorical it considers itself to be (after all, what Crispin Wright writes today will tomorrow be the past . . .). This has given rise to much speculation in the cross-field between history of philosophy and the philosophy of history, from Jonathan Rée to Charles Taylor, about whether philosophy is inherently historical or, conversely, history of philosophy is inherently philosophical, or both, and about whether the historian of philosophy should do philosophy historically or history philosophically, and so on (Rée 1978; Taylor 1984). To cite a recent contribution, Robert C. Scharff published in 2014 a book entitled How History Matters to Philosophy arguing "that both historicity itself and the question of how to approach the topic are still widely mishandled," that we must "discredit the assumption that dealing with the past is optional" since "no one thinks from scratch" and "to be human is to be and to remain historical" (Scharff 2014: 23). Sharff's call for a renewal of philosophy's conception of its past is energetic. Yet his own arguments, substantiated by readings in Dilthey, Nietzsche and Heidegger, come through to a reader familiar with the debates as mostly well-known. The logical space available for that particular discussion seems also to have been filled.

So what is to be done? It seems to me that, without it originally being the purpose of the project, Piaia and Santinello's book points to a possible exit from these debates about the philosophical relevance of the history of philosophy by giving a much-needed reflexive twist to the question itself. Let me return briefly to the current opposition between ahistorical 'philosophical' and contextual 'historical' approaches and what the book may teach us about them. Ahistorical approaches are, or so they say, concerned with the contemporary philosophical relevance of past philosophical texts as contributions to the solution of a set of perennial philosophical issues. Models of the History of Philosophy, however, demonstrates just how much variation there has in fact been in the motivations for delving into philosophy's past and in the ways that that past has been theoretically organized (into lives, sects, schools, systems, and so on.) Incidentally, this is also a point Catana has forcefully made in a recent article where he studies the long tradition of historians of philosophy -- from Georg Gustav Fülleborn to Hans-Johann Glock -- who have appealed to the notion of perennial philosophical 'problems' when writing the history of philosophy, only to discover that the lists of allegedly perennial problems each of them provides differ substantially from each other and, moreover, in each case, look conspicuously similar to lists of the philosophical problems currently debated in the philosophical context of the historian of philosophy in question (Catana 2013).

On the other side of the fence, contextualist, historical approaches are, or so they say, concerned with the exact historical reconstruction of past philosophical statements, and aspire to a certain 'disinterest' (Garber 1988). Models of the History of Philosophy, again by the accumulation of examples rather than by explicit argument, demonstrates just how much of a lure any such notion of exact historical reconstruction of past philosophy is if it does not take into account the perspective from which the history is written. There has never been such a thing as a non-partisan historiography of philosophy, but intentions and methods constantly vary according to the broader intellectual context. Indeed, as reading these volumes makes abundantly clear, general histories of philosophy have always been written, from the Renaissance to this day, so as to reflect the philosophical concerns of the historian who was writing them. In this way, the history of the history of philosophy is very closely related to what is usually referred to as reception history in philosophy. Indeed, that a philosophy is archived as part of philosophy's past in some period or place is an important and integral aspect of the way in which that philosophy is understood and received in that period or place.

Hence, in sum, Piaia and Santinello's work shows that there can be neither a genuinely non-historical evaluation of past philosophy nor a disinterested historical description of it. Any historiography of philosophy will involve parts of both. What matters is how and according to which principles those aspects are combined, i.e. the principles according to which the historiographer relates philosophy to its own history within the historiography of philosophy. In each case, those principles for conjoining philosophy with its own past form what could properly be termed various 'models' of the historiography of philosophy, each expressing how contemporary philosophical concerns, at any time or epoch in the history of philosophy, determine the way in which the history of philosophy is written and thus how philosophy's past is received in the present. It is the history of those models that one can extract from Piaia and Santinello's work. On a deeper level, this fully justifies the slight change of title between the Italian and the English versions of their work, from a history of 'general histories', to a 'history of models'. And those models are, I would suggest, exactly what the historiography of philosophy has to contribute to philosophy proper: a wide range of conceptual models for combining our intellectual past with our intellectual present. On this reflexive understand of the role of the historiography of philosophy, the question the historian of philosophy must ask in order to determine the philosophical value of his enterprise is not what relation the historiography of philosophy bears per se to philosophy, to the extent that there just is no single answer to that. It is what kind of relation between philosophy and its past a given approach produces and what principles it relies on, in short, what model it proposes.

In conclusion, I should stress the originality of the enterprise. Models of the History of Philosophy faces very little competition in the English-speaking world, where the history of the historiography of philosophy remains largely unexplored. Some impressive studies dealing with specific figures or periods in that history should however be mentioned: Catana's book on Johann Jacob Brucker and the notion of 'system' (Catana 2008); Knox Peden's recent study of the anti-phenomenological use of Spinoza in French history of philosophy in the 20th Century (Peden 2014); and, finally, Dmitri Levitin's 2015 account of the English histories of philosophy in the second half of the 17th Century, and of Thomas Stanley in particular (Levitin 2015). Moreover, several chapters in recent volumes on the methods in history of philosophy engage with the topic -- notably Schneewind's Teaching New Histories of Philosophy (2004), Rogers, Sorell and Kraye's Insiders and Outsiders in Seventeenth-Century Philosophy (2010), and Lærke, Schliesser and Smith's Philosophy and Its History (2013). But other than Models of the History of Philosophy, there exists no comprehensive English language history of the historiography of philosophy.

Important non-Anglophone historians of philosophy have, of course, worked on the topic. It is here worth mentioning two similar attempts at writing a 'history of the general history of philosophy', to use the title of the Italian version. First, Lucien Braun's Histoire de l'histoire de la philosophie (1973) works its way through the entire history of philosophy beginning with the Ancient Greek tradition, most importantly Diogenes Laertius's Lives, all the way up through the early modern period to the Enlightenment and to the "romanticist vision" of the history of philosophy in early 19th century Germany, with particular emphasis on Schelling and the people around him. In the 1980s, Martial Gueroult published his three-volume Dianoématique, or history of the history of the philosophy, accompanied by a fourth volume entitled Philosophie de l'histoire de la philosophie, providing the methodological and philosophical backdrop of his study (Gueroult 1979, 1984, 1988a, 1988b). Albeit generally ignored in the Anglo-American context and even rarely spoken about today in the French, Gueroult's work remains a very valuable resource. With his habitual knack for finding regularities in even the most diverse textual material, he makes great strides in making systematic sense of a very diverse historical development, from the Ancient pre-Socratic forms of the discipline until today. The same unity of the account does however come at a steep price: Gueroult tells the history of the historiography of philosophy from single, systematic and staunchly Cartesian perspective, something that occasions serious bias in some of his evaluations. Thus, for example, it prompts him to largely leave out the Renaissance histories due to their lack of systematicity. Or, for a more crude example, one can also note his description of the historiographical work by the anti-Cartesian Pierre-Daniel Huet as nothing less than "the negation of philosophy" (Gueroult 1984: 208-209). Those two studies, by Braun and Gueroult, are, to my knowledge, the only serious competitors to the work done by Piaia and Santinello. But none of them equals it in depth, erudition and historical impartiality.


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