Models, Truth, and Realism

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Barry Taylor, Models, Truth, and Realism, Oxford University Press, 2006, 185pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199286698.

Reviewed by Adam Kovach, Marymount University


Like Michael Dummett, Barry Taylor believes that the best way to formulate realism is as a claim about truth. Realists believe that truth is public, bivalent and epistemically independent -- that "an ideal theory constructed on the basis of all past, present and future human observation using the best epistemology, might not be objectively true." (43) In this book, Taylor attempts to justify this characterization of realism, and then argues at length that no known and defensible notion of truth preserves these realist theses. One by one, Taylor summons correspondence, "formal" (deflationary), Tarskian, model-theoretic, superassertibility and ideal-limit assertibility theories of truth to cross-examination, and finds none capable of bearing realism's burden. John McDowell's quietist realism and Hilary Putnam's common sense realism face the same treatment. In the end, Taylor sounds a grand claim:

Realism, we conclude, is dead: There is no defensible notion of truth that preserves the theses of traditional realism, nor any defensible position deserving the title of realism, through inheriting the mantle of the traditional form… . The real choice then is between different varieties of anti-realism. (165)

But is Taylor's target appropriate? Some philosophers, such as Michael Devitt, explicitly deny that realism is a view about truth. Instead, Devitt holds that realists characteristically advance a claim about the status of objects -- that the objects of a particular class exist independently from human mental activity. Taylor takes up this challenge in Part I, where he defends the Dummettian characterization of realism. Even if realists do owe us an account of truth, why must they derive all of their doctrine from the theory of truth itself? Can't they help themselves to additional assumptions? For example, a realist might accept a deflationary or a Tarskian theory of truth, and declare bivalence out of an independent commitment to classical logic. Taylor calls this a "pallid version" of realism. (150) However, both McDowell and Putnam, recently turned champion of common sense, are prominent, though pallid, realists. So, Taylor examines their views in Part III. The heart of the book comes in between. Part II is dedicated to an extended development and defense of the much criticized model-theoretic argument against realism that Putnam put forward in his 1977 paper, "Models and Realism." Since Taylor evidently believes that the set theoretic definition of truth-in-a-model for appropriately formalized sentences is the most clear and precise way of explaining truth available to us, he is eager to show that this conception of truth is not available to realists.

The book is admirably short, but dense. It assumes familiarity on the part of the reader with formal methods in the philosophy of language and technical jargon commonly used in debates over realism in contemporary analytic philosophy. It is impossible to address all formulations of realism in a work of this scale. So, Taylor may be excused for dismissing correspondence theories in the space of two paragraphs by mentioning, but not quite using, the old Frege-Church-Davidson slingshot argument (25), while dedicating almost half the book to Putnam's model-theoretic argument. Selectivity on such a broad topic is kind, but it opens Taylor to the charge of exaggeration with his conclusion that realism is dead.

A good way to read this book is to forgive its grand conclusion and treat it as a series of critical engagements with realist views in current philosophy of language. Those who know and love this literature can certainly profit from giving it another look with the aid of a persistent critic. Along the way, they will find interesting discussions of Lewis on natural kinds, Diamond on Wittgenstein on semantic competence, and Brandom on the meaning of singular terms. With regret, I must limit the rest of this review to Taylor's championing of Putnam's model-theoretic argument, and his criticisms of McDowell's brand of "quietist realism."

Putnam's Model-theoretic Argument

Taylor clarifies, and significantly modifies and extends, Putnam's original classic argument. Here is an overview of his discussion, in a dialectical format. We assume that a realist must believe that an ideal theory, T, might nonetheless be false. Let us also make an assumption that Taylor argues for at some length, that T will be consistent and expressible in a formal language which allows the proof of a completeness theorem for T.  By completeness, since T is consistent, it has a model, M. So, true-on-M is "a sense" in which T is guaranteed to be true. (59) A realist may object that unless M captures the proper meaning of T -- unless M is an intended model -- this sense of truth is irrelevant to the question of whether or not T can be false.

Putnam replies to this objection by calling on his critics to state their favorite constraint on intendedness, C, which would rule out M as an unintended model. Whatever it's content may be, C is "just more theory."  As such, C may be included with the ideal theory of T, but, Putnam rejoins, "the argument is not affected by enlarging the theory." (77) Some of Putnam's critics, notably Lewis, cry "foul" at this point. Lewis objects that adding a statement of C to T is not the same as ensuring that the ideal theory conforms to C, as the realist requires.

One of Taylor's main contributions is to meticulously develop and defend Putnam's "just more theory" maneuver. Taylor explains in detail a strategy for articulating constraint C and combining it with T, to create an extended theory T+, which includes both T and an account of the semantics of T. Taylor next shows that it can be proved in T+ that M is an intended model for T. Very well. But is T+ itself true? Since T+ is consistent, it too has a model, M+. And since T is part of T+, M+ is a model for T. So, again there is a sense in which T+ and T are true. "We are thus led to a hierarchy of languages [and theories] … At no point can the contention that some of the models of a given theory may be intended be discounted." (83) So, realism cannot make its claim that T might be false stick. 

What is a realist to make of this argument? Has a foul move been tucked away somewhere? A promising place to look for one is Taylor's suggested proof in T+ that M is an intended model for T. (82) A discerning reader will find grounds to object that the proof presupposes the very truth of the ideal theory, T, that is at issue.

McDowell's Quietist Realism

In Taylor's interpretation, McDowell's realism is built upon three main claims. (1) Tarski had the best conception of truth, because as Davidson showed, a Tarskian theory of truth can play a central role in a compositional theory of meaning for a language. Tarskian truth is not yet obviously realist truth. However, the other two claims might still deliver McDowell's realist credentials. (2) Representations are internally related to content, and (3) content is embedded in the world. That representations are internally related to content means that their meaning derives from use in a way that language users can only know a priori. We cannot explain the use of an expression in a language game reductively, "without employing the vocabulary of that game." (137) That content is world-embedded means that it depends "on the state of the world in a way which is not merely causal." (139) McDowell's famous idea here is that in veridical perception, thinkers are in direct contact with facts, which are at once parts of the world and capable of justifying beliefs. Thus the world itself -- in the first place, a world of facts -- can provide "rational constraint" on our thinking.

Since these two new claims are quite different from the allegedly traditional realist claims of bivalence and epistemic independence, it is fair to ask, does McDowell's position really deserve the title of realism? Taylor's arguments to the contrary are telling. One concerns the status of facts. McDowell's account of perception suggests that reality is in principle knowable, for it requires that "the facts in general are available to the mind." (163) Is this not an idealistic view? McDowell denies the charge of idealism on the grounds that he recognizes our epistemic duty to improve our belief system. We must believe that "there is no guarantee that the world is completely in reach of our system of concepts" at any particular moment in the history of human conceptual development. Taylor argues that merely pointing out that we have this duty cannot deflect the idealism objection, for McDowell must admit that there are no facts which remain unavailable to an epistemically ideal conceptual system. From this Taylor concludes that according to McDowell, an ideal theory must be true: "[I]f we encapsulate this ideal system in a suitable language, L, it becomes an ideal theory, all of whose theses are true" (in the sense given by a Tarskian truth theory for L.) (164) This last inference is mysterious. I do not see where Taylor has made a case that it is valid.

Another of Taylor's arguments fares better. According to McDowell's account of perception, facts are both constituents of the world and contents of thoughts. So, facts are Fregean thoughts. Their constituent parts are Fregean senses. Mind-independent objects cannot be constituents of facts. Thus it appears that McDowell is committed to an ontology of facts and senses, which leaves no room at all for real objects. We see that the rhinoceros is ready to charge. Can't we also see the rhino? McDowell's rather obscure reply is that real objects figure in facts without being constituents. The fact about the rhino is a singular fact. The sense of the singular term 'the rhino' is an "object-dependent mode of presentation" of the rhino. The existence and identity of such modes of presentation "is conceptually dependent on the existence and identity of an object which they represent." (160) Taylor rightly asks, supposing we grant McDowell this obscure idea of object-dependent singular senses, what more is there to an object on this view than "the locus around which singular senses cluster" or a "permanent possibility of conceptualization?" (161) How is this realism? Can a realist be satisfied with the view that the ultimate ontological story about a rhino is that it is an object corresponding to an equivalence class of co-reference-determining singular senses? How about you? Would it bother you, if in your most intimate being you turned out to be nothing more?

If you find this argument compelling, it is perhaps because you care about the ontological status of objects. Certainly, in his discussion of McDowell's realism, Taylor backtracks from his earlier focus on whether truth is bivalent and epistemically independent to the issue of whether objects are mind and language independent. The realist's bogeyman here is no longer an epistemic conception of truth but idealism about objects. This feeds the thought that concerns about the ontological status of objects turn out to be more important to the realism debate than Taylor lets on in the beginning of his book.

Taylor has worked hard, and he makes his readers work hard too, but it is a Herculean ambition to prove that realism is dead. As Putnam says, there are many faces of realism. Even if all of them have warts, no one will dispatch this hydra just by arguing that every known allegedly realist theory of truth is a failure. Given the state of the art, all known theories of truth -- realist and not -- can reasonably be classed as failures. If you are prepared to stab a theory of truth from any direction, you will always find weak spots. A better conclusion for the book would be that realists have their work cut out for them. Sure enough they do. Don't we all?