Modern Challenges to Past Philosophy: Arguments and Responses

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Russell Pannier and Thomas D. Sullivan, Modern Challenges to Past Philosophy: Arguments and Responses, Bloomsbury, 2014, 203pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781441170637.

Reviewed by Tom Sorell, University of Warwick


Russell Pannier and Thomas Sullivan argue that there is much of value in the philosophy of the past, and that arguments to the contrary from scientistic philosophers and anti-philosophical scientists are often questionable. I agree with them, but have doubts about their rhetorical choices, and their over-inclusive conception of philosophy. Their style of argument is often ill-suited to their chosen audiences, and their chosen audiences are sometimes wider than they should be.

Here is an argument for the importance of philosophical writings from the past that seems to me to be more or less sound (if boring):

Philosophical writings from the past are essential to teach in a first degree philosophy course, because some of those writings expound views that are profound and correct, and that have influenced a lot of philosophical work that came after them. Again, reading old philosophical texts can make it easier to grasp claims in present-day philosophical writings. Even when the views that they expound are doubtful or widely disparaged, historical texts need to be studied -- in order to motivate latter day positions that are sound, or to formulate problems that might not otherwise be seen as problems.

This argument is constrained in three ways. First, it is an argument about how philosophy should be formally taught, not an argument about the right materials for people to teach themselves philosophy. Second, it is an argument for history of philosophy at first degree level, not beyond it. In particular, no case is being made for bringing historical texts into all kinds of philosophical writing or teaching beyond undergraduate level. Third, while it is an argument for the use of historical texts, it is neutral about whether historical texts can be taught only by specialist historians of philosophy. I now enlarge on these constraints.

First, people who study for philosophy qualifications in the English-speaking world and elsewhere in the West are often introduced to the various branches of the subject by specialists, including specialists in the history of philosophy, and one of the tasks of these people is to relate material studied in one course to material students are likely to encounter in another. Texts assigned in history of philosophy courses often have a bearing on controversies in, e.g., ethics, the philosophy of mind and the philosophy of language that are followed in non-historical courses required for the same degree. Seeing the connections can be useful, even highly illuminating, for students. So history of philosophy should not be hived off.

The argument does not imply that historical texts can be taught only by specialists in the history of philosophy, but it does imply that when the texts are understood -- e.g., after training by specialists in the history of philosophy or by other philosophy specialists -- they are relevant to the non-historical parts of the subject. The argument has implications for the question -- once debated at Princeton -- of whether undergraduates should be free to say 'No' to the history of philosophy -- opt out of courses on philosophers of the past -- in universities where many topics are treated ahistorically and analytically. The argument implies that even in these universities there is a case for studying historical texts.

Second, arguments about the way that philosophy should be taught to undergraduates are not arguments about how philosophy should be practised after first degree level. In particular, the argument quoted does not say that holders of first degrees in philosophy in general and professional philosophers in particular should regularly read and refer to historical sources. The argument is neutral with respect to the use of such sources in later philosophical life. Indeed, the argument is compatible with the thesis that historical training is a preliminary to a fully developed practice that should mainly be ahistorical.

Third, the argument is not concerned with autodidacts; it is neutral on the question of whether philosophers can be self-taught or whether a disposition to ask philosophical questions is very widely-distributed -- say, because it is part of being human. The argument takes it for granted that philosophy is and ought to be taught at degree level, and simply makes a pitch for a curriculum that contains historical material in addition to non-historical material. It is unnecessary for the argument to define from first principles what philosophy is or what philosophical methods are legitimate, just as it is unnecessary for a university course syllabus at a given time to define these things explicitly. Instead, the judgements of appropriately qualified people teaching a philosophy degree at a time and place can be used to alter or maintain a syllabus that is open to comparison with syllabi taught elsewhere and over a long period by comparably qualified people to comparable students.

Since many philosophy courses in the English-speaking and wider Western world do include a lot of historical material, and since certain historical texts are taken to be canonical -- Plato's Republic, Descartes's Meditations, and Kant's first Critique are three examples -- the argument given above probably reinforces a kind of orthodoxy.

The argument given by Pannier and Sullivan is very different. Though they think that sources from the history of philosophy are indispensible to the practice of philosophy, the class of practitioners of philosophy that they recognize is much more inclusive than the class of people who have received some formal training in the subject, let alone the class of people who have been trained to degree level with a concentration or "major" in philosophy. They seem to include not only people who have read some philosophy books unaided, but also anyone whose reflections include or overlap with questions characteristic of the subject (see pp 1-2). Since some of these questions are, or overlap with, first-person questions about "the human condition" -- notably "How shall I live?" (see pp. 35; 45) -- there is a sense in which, for Pannier and Sullivan, philosophising is an aspect of being human and reflective simply, not a byproduct of systematic formal induction into an esoteric literature and a distinctive set of practices of thinking, writing, and speaking.

In short, Pannier and Sullivan want thinking people in general, or perhaps thinking people with a self-conscious urge to philosophize (p. 83), to immerse themselves in philosophers from the past: they are not addressing professional philosophers only. Pannier and Sullivan think that most reflective people have "minimal world views" (pp. 47-8) and that immersion in philosophy, including in historical philosophical texts with dialectical methods, can improve these worldviews: it can reduce their inconsistency and unreasoned acceptance, and it can make them less fragmentary, and more ordered (pp. 48-49). I wonder whether world views that are inconsistent, full of holes, and unreasoned really deserve the title 'world view' -- even with the qualification "minimal". But even if we grant Pannier and Sullivan the point that most reflective people have world views and that there are the materials in philosophical texts from the past for useful amendments to these world views, how are the reflective people to identify the texts relevant to their questions and understand the contents of those texts? If the answer is 'Take a philosophy course', then we are back to the argument given at the outset.

But this does not seem to be the answer in Pannier and Sullivan. They sometimes write as if all that is required for access to past philosophy is an ability to read, and the availability of a secondary literature in addition to the original texts:

The fact that an inquirer who has created an illuminating dialectical reflection has died should not substantially hinder the efforts of a living enquirer to resolve obscurities in that past reflection. There will often be commentators on that past reflection who offer helpful analyses of those issues, and, in any case, the enquirer can always analyse the text herself by distinguishing alternative interpretations in light of the Principle of Charity. (p. 86)

This is to read into the lay philosopher abilities of analysis that are certainly not innate, and that are sometimes never acquired by students in history of philosophy courses. Even the ability to follow commentaries cannot be presupposed. The question of accessibility is by no means a theoretical one. Editors of even canonical texts regularly have to ask themselves whether or not to modernize spelling and English. Jonathan Bennett's Early Modern Texts website makes available to a wide audience a range of material the complex style of which obstructs the understanding of otherwise intelligent students.

Considering that English-speaking students of the current generation sometimes struggle with texts in English going no further back than the 19th century, the idea that reflective members of the public could easily penetrate philosophers writing thousands of years ago in foreign languages with their own idiosyncratic technical terminology at least requires comment and defence. Either that, or a concession that books from the philosophical past are mainly accessible within the framework of a university course. As it is, the question of how accessible texts from the past are is treated by Pannier and Sullivan with breathtaking briskness, even when it is treated over most of a short chapter (pp. 174-179).

Accessibility of a different kind is an issue when it comes to the second audience that they seek to reach: professional philosophers, including those who believe that philosophy has to be thoroughly informed by, and consistent with, natural science. Pannier and Sullivan must do no less than show to their scientistic colleagues why immersion in the texts of philosophers from the past, especially the texts of those who set great store by the a priori, is as legitimate as immersion in, e.g., the neuroscience or physics journals. This is the task to which they set themselves in the second half of the book.

Here they change the subject somewhat, because they are not only defending the study of historical texts but also texts in which "pure" philosophy -- philosophy depending on a priori theorizing -- is practiced. Or, as they put it their question, "What is to be said for the defense of the idea that good-old-fashioned pure philosophy, and in particular ontology, can be conducted in an age of science?" (p.98).

Since an argument for engaging dialectically with philosophy from the past is an argument for engaging with at least some philosophers -- e.g., Russell and Hume -- who would reject "good-old-fashioned pure philosophy," this change of subject needs an acknowledgement and explanation that it does not get.

The change of subject crops up again when Pannier and Sullivan argue directly against scientism (pp. 107-125). They present a range of negative scientistic arguments. Three of these arguments -- the "success" argument, the "replacement" argument and the "poverty of means" argument -- make it sufficient for rejecting the study of philosophers of the past that "pure ontology, past and present" is worthless. The "replacement argument" (p. 107) is to the effect that since science has been successful and philosophy has not been, pure philosophy is worthless, and therefore philosophy from the past is worthless. But this argument only goes through if pure philosophy and philosophy from the past are run together, and some past philosophy is to the effect that philosophy should not be pure, that it should be based on experience in some sense. Since that kind of philosophy may even anticipate the scientism that Pannier and Sullivan attack, the texts that expound it cannot be among those that scientistic philosophers want other philosophers to abandon. To that extent even the scientistic might recognize some canonical philosophers -- if not Hume, then perhaps Russell and Quine. Similarly, and contrary to the "replacement" argument (p. 110f), future philosophy is unlikely to replace material that favours the replacement of philosophy by science. These arguments only get off the ground if philosophy from the past is incorrectly identified with pure philosophy. As for the "poverty of means" argument (p.120), it not only continues questionably to harness together the usefulness of past philosophy with the usefulness of pure philosophy, but it seems questionably to associate "pure" philosophy and ontology primarily with the scholastics -- rather than Descartes, Leibniz, Spinoza or Kant.

In a penultimate chapter, the authors take aim at "revolutionary" philosophies that call for the clearing up of the pre-revolutionary past. Some of these revolutionaries are "end-of-philosophy" theorists; others proclaim a new methodology that, if followed, would replace a bankrupt pre-revolutionary body of pseudo-philosophy with the real thing. Although Pannier and Sullivan agree with the revolutionaries that the history of philosophy has been messy and conflicting (p.159), they deny that the conflict has been harmful and that it can or should be eliminated in the future. A perpetual philosophical peace is impossible, according to them, because philosophical understanding is inevitably individual rather than consensual and not open methodologically to definitive results, as science and mathematics are (pp. 160-61).

It is surprising, and perhaps a kind of betrayal of their main line of thought, that Pannier and Sullivan agree so readily with the revolutionaries about the chaos of past philosophy. An important benefit of specialised history of philosophy is to introduce order into the philosophy of the past, e.g., by showing how the conflict in past philosophy can be represented as a range of disagreements over questions recognized by antagonists as worth answering. Chaos is more likely to be the appearance thrown up by scientistic ignorance than by study of the texts and the period in which they were written. The existence of histories of philosophy is at least prima facie evidence for the possibility that the thought of the past need not be conceded to be chaotic.

True to their own insistence that philosophy must be dialectical, Pannier and Sullivan frame the whole book as a continuous argument for a single overarching thesis, with many objections systematically addressed as they go along. A distinctive element of the overall argument is their defence of the idea that philosophy has an essence (ch. 2), and that the main questions addressed by philosophy fall into two classes, some connected to the human condition and formulable in the first person, others more impersonally expressible and arising from "wonder" in Aristotle's sense. Although the claim that philosophy has an essence is eye-catching, and although it is worked out in quite a lot of detail, it seemed to me to be undermined by other claims at the very beginning of the book that set the threshold for counting as philosophy too low, and made philosophy too culturally unspecific.

The format of unremitting examination of premises, conclusions and objections may give the book a sort of rigor, but it is radically unsuited to one of the two audiences that the authors say they want to reach, namely "those who, although not consciously inclined to pursue philosophical inquiry, are at least curious about what it would be like to live in that mode" (p. 83). This audience will quickly lose interest or lose their way, as the book often lurches from the folksy to the arcane in a few sentences. An example:

During your writing session, you consider whether to drink a cup of tea while working. Assuming that neither alternative will make any difference to your efficiency or creativity, the question "Should I have a cup of tea?" is not a human-condition question in that context.

Second, in referring to potentially limitless classes, we are invoking the Aristotelian conception of potential infinity, in contrast to the Cantorian conception of actual infinity. (pp. 39-40)

As I think that Pannier and Sullivan should not have targeted a lay audience in the first place, I am not sure that the failure to get on to their wavelength matters so much. But given their own goals, their choice of literary means is quite puzzling.

What about the other chosen audience, namely academic philosophers? Here again, I think, the wrong communicative strategy has been adopted. To persuade philosophers who avoid historical texts to rethink their practice, the right way to proceed, it seems to me, is by trying to engage interestingly in the philosophy of mind or ethics or some other branch of philosophy by using the ideas of the relevant philosopher or philosophers. Either that or to write about the relevant philosopher from the past, making clear their relevance to issues of continuing philosophical importance. Bernard Williams' Descartes: the Project of Pure Enquiry is an example of the latter; Martha Nussbaum's various attempts to marry Aristotleian ethics with Amartya Sen's capability measures of development are an example of the former. There are also lessons to be learned in non-historical parts of philosophy from the use of certain historical philosophers as hate-figures -- Descartes in our own day, Aristotle in the 17th century. Anti-Cartesianism commands mainstream interest, not just the interest of historians of philosophy. These approaches are very different from that of Pannier and Sullivan.