Modern Honor: A Philosophical Defense

Placeholder book cover

Anthony Cunningham, Modern Honor: A Philosophical Defense, Routledge, 2013, 188pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415823845.

Reviewed by Erich Hatala Matthes, Wellesley College


This is a book of, and about, stories. Anthony Cunningham's method is to proffer detailed examinations of what he calls "honor stories" (both historical and contemporary, fictional and real), with the aim of distilling those features of honor that are beneficial, even necessary, to a flourishing human life. The stories range from Icelandic Sagas to honor killings, from dueling in the Old South to The Iliad (the touchstone for Cunningham's discussion of honor). Cunningham is sensitive to honor's sordid history and spends considerable time in the book's early pages detailing the ways in which appeals to honor have been employed in the service of reinforcing hierarchies based on race, class, and gender. As he puts it: "The undeniable fact is that these honor stories clash with a well-entrenched humanistic vision in Western democracies. The vision is best understood in terms of human flourishing against a backdrop of 'Liberté, egalité, fraternité'" (46).

Despite honor's questionable history and its seeming incompatibility with Western liberal values, Cunningham argues that there is nothing about honor itself that stands in opposition to these values. Rather, honor involves a combination of objective excellence and recognition of that excellence by a community, both of which are necessary and neither sufficient (15). Honor's downfall stems from the application of unsavory standards of excellence, but the idea of measuring ourselves against noble standards and holding ourselves to exemplifying them can serve the aims of liberty, equality, and fraternity.

When we look at saga characters, samurai, or Southern gentlemen and lament the disconcerting features of their honor codes, the real problem is the particular content of those codes, not the sheer fact that they measured themselves by some vision of excellence. . . . Ultimately, honor can be only as good as its content. Honor is an inherent reflection of the things we hold dear. (68)

In order to illustrate the good that honor can do, Cunningham sketches an account of the standards of excellence appropriate to a sense of "modern honor": ways, as he puts it, of "being," "relating," and "doing," that center around the virtues of dignity, courage, fidelity, honesty, fortitude, compassion, and gratitude (97). Given this kind of content, honor in fact plays a central role in contemporary ethics, holding us to these standards and expressing our sense of their importance.

The most compelling portions of the book are those early chapters in which Cunningham traces the concept and practice of honor across diverse times and places, and draws from these many instances a common core that can survive criticism. The fourth chapter in particular, "Is Honor Inevitably Flawed?" provides careful consideration of the reasons one might be compelled to throw the baby out with the bathwater in rejecting traditional honor stories, and does an admirable job defending the idea that measuring ourselves against certain standards, and holding ourselves and others to those standards, need not be morally suspect. Cunningham generally uses stories to great effect, particularly in this earlier part of the book. I appreciate his attention to the intricacies of moral life, and his use of specific accounts of that life in order to display its many facets. I agree that stories have an important role to play in moral philosophy, and Cunningham demonstrates that role well in these pages.

It is the remainder of the book, in which Cunningham develops the content of modern honor, where I begin to have trouble. This is not because I disagree with Cunningham's discussion of the standards of excellence that our sense of honor ought to speak to, but rather because there is so little there with which to disagree. In chapter five, Cunningham contends that dignity, courage, fidelity, honesty, fortitude, compassion, and gratitude are the central virtues of modern honor. In chapter six, he champions the importance of relating with others through love, respect, and humanity, and living up to our character and commitments in the way we act. But who would object to the idea that love, respect, compassion, honesty, etc. are, generally speaking, important ideals in human moral life? The account rings true, but only because it is so generic. These chapters are full of pronouncements such as "We must deliberate and judge wisely, choose accordingly, and act resolutely, and these things are easier said than done" (80) and "the precious seeds of humanity are there to be cultivated in the soil of admiration and compassion" (109). Unfortunately, this fortune-cookie wisdom does little to deepen our understanding of any of these virtues, each of which receives only a passing treatment.

What does emerge from these chapters is that Cunningham is deeply mistrustful of the impersonality that he takes to be the hallmark of moral philosophy and its attempt to ground all of morality in a passionless appeal to reason alone (75, 93, 124, 127, 139, 148-9, 156, 158 . . .). If this were an accurate characterization of the current state of moral philosophy, then Cunningham's description of the virtues and their centrality might seem fresh and provocative. But these kinds of concerns with a hardliner Kantianism are so familiar now that there is little to be gained from merely repeating them, at least for a philosophical audience. Perhaps that is not the intended audience of the book, but it is certainly the audience for this journal. These chapters might not seem so out of touch if they were situated with respect to the rich philosophical work on the virtues that has been written during the past few decades, but, surprisingly, there is no discussion of any of this literature. This is deeply puzzling for a book that gives the virtues pride of place.

The book's distance from the philosophical literature continues to resurface throughout the later chapters. In the eighth chapter, "Whose Honor?", Cunningham discusses how we might determine what content for our sense of honor is ultimately the best one. Drawing on Bernard Williams, he insists that moral philosophy is mistaken to search for an "Archimedean point" with which to ultimately justify a single vision of the best way to live, and that we must ultimately embrace pluralism about values. He writes:

So long as we do not come at 'morality' with the philosophical blinders of reducing moral values to one kind of thing or else a small number with some canonical ordering, we can realize that the range of things that matter in human lives and the variety of ways in which they matter are many. (149)

Those would be some very particular philosophical blinders. Despite what Cunningham seems to assume, the kind of pluralism that he advocates here is not at all anathema to modern moral philosophy. It is the cornerstone of important and influential work by Elizabeth Anderson and Joseph Raz, to name just two prominent examples.[1] Yet from Cunningham's discussion alone, one could easily be forgiven for coming to the conclusion that value pluralism was finding its first advocate in these pages. Again, perhaps this chapter would be revelatory and illuminating for a general audience, but it is difficult to say what those familiar with the contemporary literature are meant to take away from it.

Cunningham is appropriately mindful of the worry that talk of "honor" might be merely window-dressing on an account of the virtues (117). Thus, in chapter seven, "Shameless Morality," Cunningham attempts to establish that a sense of honor is in fact necessary to a flourishing life. This promises to be one of the most important chapters, and Cunningham adeptly motivates the idea of honor's indispensability through his careful use of stories. For instance, after one story about a retired undertaker attending to the dead after the 2011 earthquake in Japan, he acknowledges: "This kind of story can certainly be told without any reference to honor. One might tell it in terms of basic kindness, respect, a concern for the common good, or noble gestures in a time of extreme need" (137). However, Cunningham contends that honor has an essential role to play in the story: "without the psychology of honor, key elements of the story are invisible. . . . he experienced the call [to action] as a kind of constitutional 'must' essentially related to his identity" (137-8). We leave out honor at the cost of being unable to describe explicit moral elements of the story.

The idea, however, that a call to duty stems from a sense of one's identity (and the threat of its loss) is not unfamiliar: it has had no less a champion than Christine Korsgaard, who is, of course, a Kantian.[2] Thus, a contemporary disciple of the philosophical tradition that Cunningham sets himself in opposition to throughout the book has famously advocated the very core of Cunningham's concept of honor. This is not to prejudge which account of the notion is more successful, but it would have been fascinating to read a discussion of what differentiates Cunningham's approach from Korsgaard's, given their evident similarities. After all, Cunningham argues that Kantian theory is inadequate, but that a sense of honor is necessary. The possibility of deriving the heart of that very sense of honor from Kantian commitments thus poses a pointed challenge to Cunningham's view.

[1] Elizabeth Anderson, Value in Ethics and Economics (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1995); Joseph Raz, The Morality of Freedom (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1986); Joseph Raz, Engaging Reason (Oxford; New York: Oxford University Press, 1999).

[2] Christine Korsgaard, The Sources of Normativity (New York: Cambridge University Press, 1996).