Modernism and the Language of Philosophy

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Anat Matar, Modernism and the Language of Philosophy, Routledge, 2006, 196pp., $113.00 (hbk), ISBN 0415353793.

Reviewed by Fabrice Pataut, Institut d'Histoire et de Philosophie des Sciences et des Techniques, Paris


Modernism, in the book under review, is characterized as the belief that "there can be no philosophical language; that the kind of truth sub specie aeterni that was sought by philosophers is either meaningless or more appropriately expressed by the arts -- especially by literature and poetry" (p. xiii). The author wishes to show that this thesis rests upon unquestioned dogmas, presuppositions or presumptions "regarding the distinction between representation and presentation," which should be rejected (p. 9). She proposes to criticize the distinction, along with the other unwarranted distinctions thereby embedded in the central tenet of modernism, and to overcome the "modernist overcoming of metaphysics" by drawing on the works of Jacques Derrida and Michael Dummett.

Before discussing the thesis, its presuppositions, and Matar's criticism of both, it will be helpful to look at the author's conception of the discipline of philosophy, since it plays an important role in her arguments, and indeed structures her overall outlook on the topic of modernism as she has characterized it.

According to the author, philosophy is a discipline which "necessarily includes (or better: equals) its 'meta-level'" (p. xiv). Undeniably, philosophy has often reflected upon itself. Quite often, a particular philosophical enterprise is triggered by dissatisfaction with previous ways of conceiving philosophy, and by a negative appraisal of its previous methods and (alleged) results. Kant, of course, comes to mind; but so do many others as divergent as, say, Thales, Saint Augustine, Descartes, Hegel and Wittgenstein. Obviously, the modal claim of necessary inclusion, and, a fortiori, the strict identification of philosophical claims with meta-philosophical ones, is considerably stronger than the mere observation that previous philosophers have failed to reach their goals. In that stronger perspective, the auto-reflexive nature of philosophical theorizing is taken to be consubstantial to philosophy as such. When working within it, no matter how critically, we run the risk of blurring crucial differences between criticisms and appraisals of philosophical arguments and positions, especially when discussing modernism. I am not convinced that Matar successfully, or even appropriately, reads some of the authors she wishes to engage with her project. The inclusion of Dummett (and, by the same token, of followers of Dummett's antirealist arguments) is indeed fairly symptomatic of this bringing together -- and, at times, blending -- of quite distinct theses and standpoints sharing a common interest for language and its capacity to represent truly, or to express truths.

As far as I can see, neither Frege and Husserl, nor Carnap and Dummett, whom Matar considers in her book, have argued for philosophical positions which either 'include' meta-philosophical theses, or straightforwardly amount to any. Frege's charge that previous philosophers had failed to give a satisfactory account of the nature of numbers might perhaps be understood as a view about philosophy, and even about an important aspect of philosophy's struggle with a core component of rationality; but his own logicist account in no way 'includes' such criticism, or requires the defense of any meta-philosophical conception concerning the relevant previous philosophical failures, e.g. the ones guilty of psychologism (see Frege 1950, esp. §§ 45, 62, 68-83). More to the point, given Matar's overall project, consider Dummett. Her anti-realism consists in a cluster of semantic theses about the nature of truth, the fundamental one being that truth may not transcend the possibility of its recognition by us (see Loar 1987 for a clear presentation). As such, it is quite distinct from, say, the further methodological claim that the settling of traditional metaphysical disputes rests on the previous settling of the semantic dispute concerning which form a theory of meaning should take: should truth, possibly undetected, be its central concept, or shouldn't it? (See Dummett 1978; the preface, in particular, is helpful with respect to this point.) Similar kinds of remarks might be made about Carnap's criticism of traditional philosophy, or metaphysics, with regard to his own syntactic conception of the philosophical positions he wishes to defend, particularly in the philosophy of mathematics (See Carnap 1937, esp. Part V).

Matters are quite different, of course, with Derrida; and also -- from a different point of view -- with literary theorists like Blanchot, and authors of fictional works such as Artaud and Mallarmé, who have reflected on the notions of truthfulness, betrayal or deceit by linguistic means, and the inexpressible. (See Blanchot 1993, but also Paulhan, whom Matar could well have resorted to, on the idea that the adequacy of language to extra-linguistic reality creates a beneficial state of "terror", in Paulhan 1990, esp. Parts I and III.) Much of Derrida's deconstructive attack rests on the idea that western philosophy has developed as a meta-theoretical enterprise whose basic tenets have to be identified and criticized. Privileged among these is the idea that there is indeed such a thing as a (or even the) language of philosophy, a language particularly suited to the grasp and expression of supposedly unrevisable (so-called "eternal") truths pertaining to the traditional sub-domains of the discipline.

As Matar rightly observes, the deconstruction of the presentation/representation distinction, which Derrida put forward early on (see Derrida 1973), is central to this criticism. It is a great merit of Matar's book to focus on this particular point, rather than on the much debated notion of logocentrism, a Derridean topic par excellence.

The distinction, according to Matar, is the same as, or is indistinguishable from, that between gesture and talk. This, it seems to me, stretches Derrida's point a bit too far; moreover, it is, in a way, reductive. One could say, with more restraint, that the gesture/talk distinction is a special case of the distinction between original or ostensive presentation, and subsequent (alleged) re-presentations of the original and direct presence (of, say, objects). What counts here is that both presentation (Darstellung) and representation (Vorstellung) are taken to be 'myths' (p. 108), which lead to fallacies or non-sequiturs. First of all, these points, whether correct or not, are distinct. The fact that presentations do not occur in a void, and the fact that language may fail to represent, are two-way independent (not just logically). Moreover, suppose, for the sake of argument, that there is simply no such thing as a pure unmediated presentation: one needs a context, both linguistic and cultural, for any genuine presentation to take place. As for re-presentation, suppose that the representational model of language is faulty, and leads to unwarranted beliefs about the alleged unlimited capacities of language to represent extra-linguistic items, whatever these may be: facts, states of affairs, aspects, etc. (see esp., pp. 51-57). How do these drawbacks relate to the realist conception of truth challenged by Dummett's arguments and, in particular, to the idea that a solution to the debate about the nature of truth will yield metaphysical benefits? After all, if, say, the metaphysically deflated redundancy theory of truth of the kind advocated by Horwich (Horwich 1990), were the philosophical norm (and it is indeed in some philosophical quarters), Dummett's anti-realist argument would still hold. In this case, we would simply be urged to show that the disquotational "true" we resort to as a device for generalizing the assertions we are prone to make, might transcend verifiability by us (either hic et nunc, or in the long run of scientific inquiry). One would have liked Matar to take this aspect of the question into consideration.

As for metaphysics, one has to be cautious. Quite different kinds of worries may be addressed when so-called metaphysical questions are taken into consideration. One may think of questions like "Why is there something rather than nothing?", or "Why is there what there is rather than something else?" We may call these static questions. Then there are dynamic questions about what we are ontologically committed to when accepting theories or conceptual schemes, the answer to which will change according to the theories or schemes we believe at face value. If we answer in the positive the question whether objects of a certain kind, or belonging to a certain class, exist (say, numbers, or colours), there will be the further ontological question of the independence of such objects (and of their properties), from both language and thought, and the still further question of the full determinacy of the relevant domains.

It is difficult to understand where Matar's project of an overcoming of the overcoming of metaphysics stands with respect to this distinction. One may find Matar's book wanting on this point; it would nevertheless be unjust to dismiss its guiding claim just because the distinction isn't put to use. It might on the contrary prove rewarding to recast some of the things the book puts forward in terms of a critique of the critique of metaphysics with this distinction in mind. To begin with a negative point, although both Dummett and Derrida believe in the inescapability of metaphysics, they don't share a common conception of metaphysics (see, e.g., pp. 44 and 110 for a claim to the contrary), and therefore point to quite different things with respect to inescapability. Dummett argues that realist semantics and classical logic express in a non-metaphorical way the fundamental components of the common sense idea that reality is determinately fixed independently of our cognitive make-up. Derrida points to the fact that any metaphysical position, including seemingly argued answers to static questions, rests on unwarranted assumptions about the presentation/representation distinction; so much so that it is illusory to believe that an account, or rationale, of logos itself might be given by means of philosophical arguments. (see, e.g., pp. 142-143). The idea that a semantics, or a theory of meaning and truth, implicitly incorporates metaphysical claims, is quite distinct from the meta-theoretical view that arguments in favour of metaphysical positions as such are in a quite serious sense flawed, or even doomed.

Dummett (Dummett 1994: 353, quoted by Matar at p. 148) asserts that "we have no business to assume the existence 'in reality' of a specific limit to the theoretically possible sequence of ever narrower determinations". Dummett's point in this instance is about the objective limits of a sharpening of whatever predicates we might resort to when trying to carve up reality in a relevant and objective way. Contrary to what Matar believes, this is not

the point Derrida drives at with the figure of Thoth [the god of science and numbers], emphasizing that numbers, these traditional stabilisers [?], have no location, are no substance, and cannot be used as a metaphysical backbone of a stable, saturated reality.

Likewise, the proposal that we should "abandon our prejudice that there must be a complete description of reality" (Dummett 1978: 357) is not the most accurate way to introduce metaphysical anti-realism (p. 121). The problem isn't so much the completeness per se, as it is the possible unavailability of parts or aspects of reality whose existence and independence it would nevertheless be rational to postulate.

Some claims about logic and meta-logic are not quite acceptable, e.g., the claim that Derrida deduces the semantic principle of tertium datur from Gödel's Incompleteness Theorem (p. 182, note 12), or the repeated criticism to the effect that logic doesn't rest on assumptions that "correspond to anything in the world". Others are puzzling: what are we to make of the idea that "anti-realism" is dialectics (p. 112)?

On the positive side, chapters 6, 7 and 8 deserve special attention, for they might provide genuine points of contact between the two traditions Matar considers, the continental and the analytic. One would have liked chapter 6 to be more specific, and hence more substantial, in this respect, since the thesis of the "apparent primacy of language", which is crucial to Matar's critique, might be understood in a number of quite different, and even incompatible ways. Dummett, for one, certainly thinks that philosophy of language is prior to other areas of philosophy, e.g. the philosophy of mind and thought, but this conceptual primacy is far removed from Derrida's denial of prelinguistic "simplicity". A rejection of the so-called "priority thesis" of language over thought and mental content, certainly doesn't entail the rejection of Derrida's critique of a pure unmediated "given".

Chapters 7 and 8 deal, respectively, with psychologism and Husserl's relation to the linguistic turn. Derrida's claim that Husserl at once embraces and betrays the linguistic turn is odd at first sight, and Matar is right to point -- with great precision -- to obscurities and infelicities in its formulation. She might have pushed her critique further still. Paying more attention to the way Husserl himself (i.e. neither read by Derrida nor Dummett) understood the relation between the two opposite conceptions of truth at stake here, might have been helpful. Matar's analysis and critique of the linguistic turn with respect to this debate clearly points to an area of research in which anyone wishing to understand the common origins of both analytical and continental philosophy should be interested.

Husserl argued that truth relativized to Evidenzen, or constrained by such an epistemic notion, and absolute or unrelativized truth, depend on each other (see Husserl 1969, and Tragesser 1984 for a good discussion of this point). Dummett clearly thinks the two may not be reconciled, and has never argued that semantics, either classical or not, should be overcome in any sense (see p. 117). Derrida rejects both. Husserl had reasons to believe that the sentences we validate must also be objectively true, i.e. true independently of our validations, in great part because validation or fulfillability relations themselves provide the principles for reasoning about the relevant ontological regions.

There is a significant difference between philosophical theses and arguments as such, and philosophical claims embedded in works of fiction, or in reflections pertaining to the possibility of literature. Matar herself recognizes that "there is something essentially concealing in literature and poetry, and something essentially explicit, unveiling, in philosophy" (p. 170). One fruitful way to open the dialogue Matar wishes to establish would be to consider acts of thoughts pertaining to the domain of fiction. Whether or not philosophical truths would be better expressed in languages pertaining to other disciplines than in any purported "language of philosophy", is a different question altogether.


Blanchot (Maurice), 1993, The Infinite Conversation, engl. trans., S. Hanson, University of Minnesota Press, Minneapolis.

Carnap (Rudolph), 1937, The Logical Syntax of Language, engl. trans., A. Smeaton, Routledge and Kegan Paul, London.

Derrida (Jacques), 1973, Speech and Phenomena, engl. trans., D. B. Allilson, Northwestern UP, Evanston, Illinois.

Dummett (Michael), 1978, Truth and Other Enigmas, Harvard UP, Cambridge, Mass.

- 1994, "Reply to McGuinness", The Philosophy of Michael Dummett, B. McGuinness and G. Oliveri, eds., Kluwer, Dordrecht.

Frege (Gottlob), 1950, The Foundations of Arithmetic, engl. trans., J. L. Austin, Northwestern UP, Evanston, Illinois.

Horwich (Paul), 1990, Truth, Basil Blackwell, Oxford.

Husserl (Edmund), 1969, Formal and transcendental logic, engl. trans., D. Cairns, Husserliana, The Hague.

Loar (Brian), 1987, "Truth Beyond All Verification", Michael Dummett: Contributions to Philosophy, B. Taylor, ed., Martinus Nijhoff Publishers, Dordrecht.

Paulhan (Jean), 1990, Les fleurs de Tarbes ou la terreur dans les lettres, J.-C. Zylberstein, éd., Folio Essais, Gallimard, Paris.

Tragesser (Robert S.), 1984, Husserl and Realism in Logic and Mathematics, Cambridge UP, Cambridge.