Modernity in Indian Social Theory

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A. Raghuramaraju, Modernity in Indian Social Theory, Oxford University Press, 2011, 158pp., $45.50 (hbk), ISBN 9780198070122.

Reviewed by Thom Brooks, Newcastle University


The idea of modernity presents different challenges in Western and non-Western traditions. Raghuramaraju argues that the ways in which modernity has been conceived in one tradition does not apply in another with important philosophical results. These issues have often been addressed using Western philosophical approaches. One problem is that these approaches may have limited applications in the case of India. Instead, Raghuramaraju celebrates and further develops a distinctly Indian philosophical approach that attempts to improve our understanding about modernity in contemporary Indian society. I found the analysis and philosophical commentary illuminating and at times inspirational.

This review will outline the central arguments presented in Modernity in Indian Social Theory before concluding with some general overall remarks focussing on lessons learned and the wider philosophical implications arising from the discussion.

The book begins by noting that modernity is a product of India's colonial legacy. This primarily normative movement sought to disinherit the country's past. Modernity prioritized its ideals of autonomy, rationality, and freedom that were imposed through programmes aimed at promoting Indian nationalism, industrialization, and secularism (1). A problem is that the Western idea of modernity is temporal whereas modernity co-exists with pre-modernity in contemporary Indian society.[1] This is understood as a 'social fact' about India. He says: 'India is a good example of a society that is neither pre-modern nor distinctly modern'; India is a place where 'modernity has to reckon with the pre-modern' (2-3). This is the case because it is an idea that has been imported from the West.

Raghuramaraju next summarises central historical developments in the Western idea of modernity from Descartes through Rousseau to Freud with select references to other key figures. One key idea is that modernity includes an inevitability of disinheriting the past. This is traced in three movements. The first is 'the attempt of the self to create its own realities' through social contract (11). The second is the conception of the economy, evolution, and history in terms of a singular developmental path. The third is the idea that the self attempts to transform reality against its own self-image. Each of these three movements is presented broadly in recognition that they are subject to sometimes significant variation. For modernity, we have our roots in a state of nature, but such roots are non-historical and 'a mere postulation' that 'suffers from solipsism and emptiness' (14). This opens an important gap, for Raghuramaraju, between modernity's conception of the self and social reality where the latter is conceived as little more than a (quoting Anthony Giddens) 'sociological imagination' (19). Modernity may be opposed to pre-modern tradition, but the former does not satisfactorily engage with the latter.

This account purposefully adopts a different perspective than many other accounts. The reason for this distinctive approach is to better illuminate where Indian social theorists have been mistaken about modernity in relation to India. Therefore, Raghuramaraju's primary aim is not to attempt to convince Western philosophers that their understanding of modernity is flawed in relation to Western societies. Nevertheless, we will see that an important implication of his arguments is that they reveal important limitations about how modernity has been conceived thus far (primarily by Western philosophers). Raghuramaraju thus addresses an Indian problem that has global implications for how all philosophers should approach modernity.

The arrival of modernity in India brought with it new ideas that challenged India's self-conception. One such idea is nationalism. This is often conceived as 'an imagined political community' where it is possible 'to "think" the nation' (29). The idea of 'the nation' had been largely absent from the Indian philosophical tradition prior to its colonial history. For Raghuramaraju, nationalism has become an oppressive cultural import that 'attempted to homogenize the plural Indian society' in a drive for domination (39). He refers to nationalism as a form of 'trespassing' that sought to induce an internalization that betrays the distinctively rich pluralism that has characterized the Indian continent for centuries (39). This has raised particular problems regarding the ideology of Hindutva, as espoused by V. D. Savarkar, concerning a mistaken idea about Hindu unity (50-53). The idea of national unity competes against the many different forms of community that define individual identities. While this is not unique to Indian society, the argument is that Indian diversity has something unique about it that exacerbates existing problems for nationalism in new ways: India is a land of many nationalisms, or 'pluralities of nationalism', that challenge us to reconsider the place of 'the nation' for this society (53). India's present co-exists with its past.

Polygamy is an example of how the modern co-exists with the pre-modern in contemporary Indian society.[2] Polygamy most often takes the form of polygyny where one man has two or more wives. Polygyny was a feature of traditional Indian society until its legal ban in Section 5 of the Hindu Marriage Act 1955. Raghuramaraju argues that the legal ban on polygamy has led to 'polygynyless patriarchy', often depicted in popular films where men have relations with two women, but sequentially rather than simultaneously (55). These depictions subconsciously recall the earlier tradition while strictly speaking follow current customs. Raghuramaraju says: 'though apparently there is no polygyny from the point of view of the hero, from the point of view of the viewers, their envisioning and voyeurism ultimately gives them the same feeling as if polygyny were being committed' (57). He adds: 'The notable point here is that there exists an active though stealthy negotiation between the modern law and the response from the pre-modern patriarchal institution family in its reordering of one of its elements, namely polygyny' (57). Furthermore, there is a wider context to be considered relating to the different distinct marriage customs and patriarchal institutions across India's many diverse communities that bears on these issues. Where polygamy has been rejected, patriarchy remains problematic and unfortunately an enduring feature of society that requires further resistance.

Modernity has introduced a distinctive idea about individualism to Indian society that raises other challenges. For Raghuramaraju, India remains 'largely a pre-modern society' (64-65). The pre-modern conception of self is more thoroughly communitarian; the modern self is conceived more individualistically. This has led to a sometimes tragic tension between these competing ideas about self-identity. Increased urbanization has raised new concerns from a sociological standpoint. Persons transitioning between rural communities and urban cities move across a spatial divide as well as a philosophical bridge from rich communalism and a greater presence of religiosity to individualism and greater secularism. Raghuramaraju describes this mixture of individuals with communities as 'hybridity': the problem of negotiating between 'what is left and what is yet to be arrived at' that has flared up into communal violence in certain instances (67). The Indian condition is characterized by the presence of both in relation to each other. This reveals something distinctive about Indian diversity and ethical communities. Citing D. L. Sheth: 'These numerous entities, however, did not live in isolation, nor did they enjoy complete autonomy vis-a-vis each other. They shared a symbolic meaning system, which ensured fluidity of cultural expressions among them at different levels' (73). While critical of certain aspects of Sheth's wider argument, Raghuramaraju claims that the ways in which modernity has been conceived in the West do not allow easy translation to the distinctive Indian situation. This is not an argument that modernity is irrelevant, but rather that modernity can have relevance and great importance if it is reconsidered.

While the above is but a mere sketch, I hope that some of the general contours of Raghuramaraju's arguments have some clarity. This text had the rare delight of not only providing, to my mind, convincing accounts of several important issues, but forcing open new doors for further consideration regarding several lessons learned from this analysis. The first is the need for a better appreciation of how many of our social and political concepts are grounded upon culturally-specific ideas about the self in relation to society. This should encourage us to consider more carefully how many (if any) of our concepts have genuine universal application. The case of modernity presents one amongst many illuminating examples. A second lesson is that pluralism should not be understood as a problem to be overcome, but rather a social fact about diversity to be embraced (98-99).

The wider philosophical implications of this account extend far beyond debates about modernity. Far too often philosophical debates have taken place in traditions largely isolated from others. In our pursuit of the most compelling philosophical view, there is much potential promise in greater engagement with different philosophical traditions. The purpose is not to compare how different traditions have addressed similar issues, but rather to gain new insights into how major issues may be better understood. Raghuramaraju has demonstrated that such an account is possible and yields rewards. This book is a model for how philosophy might build new bridges between traditions for real benefits. As our world shrinks, this model may well shed light on our common future. And the future looks bright.

[1] References are made to the 'Western' tradition throughout for ease of presentation. This usage rejects the idea of a monolithic idea about this tradition, which is shared by Raghuramaraju, too (28, 30-31, 68).

[2] See Thom Brooks, 'The Problem with Polygamy', Philosophical Topics 37 (2009): 109-22.