Modes of Creativity: Philosophical Perspectives

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Irving Singer, Modes of Creativity: Philosophical Perspectives, MIT Press, 2011, 309pp., $36.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262014922.

Reviewed by Stephanie Ross, University of Missouri-St. Louis


Irving Singer's book, Modes of Creativity: Philosophical Perspectives, examines creativity across a number of disparate realms. The unifying thread Singer posits is that all creative activities are transformative in some respect. And because he believes that "much, or even all, of life can be treated as one or another example of transformation" (p. 12), creativity in Singer's sense is ubiquitous. At his most portentous, Singer characterizes the quest for creativity as "a means of coping with the sense of dread and often desperation that resides generically in the human condition" (p. 1). The opening chapter situates this theory in an expansive framework, first distinguishing it from the accounts common to process philosophy and then offering a tantalizing peek at the way the view emerged from Singer's earlier writings on love, sexuality, and the nature of film (p. 13). I myself would have been happier had Singer started with the second point, as the very brief sketches he offers of the views of Whitehead, Bergson, and Hartshorne hardly suffice to motivate them for non-initiates, and his overall intent is to reject the account of creativity associated with this school.

In Chapter One, Singer discusses some familiar examples that are cited in discussions of creativity: Archimedes's bathtub insight and Kekulé's serpent dream. Singer is at pains to dismiss the traditional link between dreaming and creativity; he disparages this general association as a mere "metaphorical locution" (p. 19). He suggests that taking time off from the intense pursuit of a problem -- whether by merely resting or by sleeping and dreaming -- fosters creativity by providing rest, relaxation, and renewed vigor (p. 47). Since the notion of transformation is at the center of Singer's positive account of creativity, he might have considered revisiting Descartes's Meditation I account comparing the dreamer's and painter's creativity. Descartes's gloss on creativity as recombination strikes me as clearly congruent with Singer's approach.

Singer's chapter explicating the creative process posits a vegetative element in our being and asserts that "our creativity operates through principles of time-dependent vitality that are comparable to those in trees and shrubs and 'lower organisms'" (p. 56). Part of what Singer hopes to take away from this is an emphasis on the passage of time. He examines our capacity for learning, an ability he says is "rooted in our temporality" (p. 57), but he takes as his prime example learning to ride a bike -- the philosopher's classic example of learning how as opposed to learning that. The ability to learn anything is special and wondrous; at one point Singer marvels, "How does one teach anyone anything?" (p. 60). I suspect that any detailed answer must acknowledge goings-on at the sub-personal level, our ability to build new neural networks in response to new experience. If this is the human capacity Singer is tracking, it seems too broadly distributed to capture what is distinctive about those special instances of creativity that he cited earlier -- Archimedes and Kekulé.

Singer takes Michelangelo's Slave struggling to be freed from the block of marble as a trope for his overall theory. He sees imaginative ideas emerging from crude and partly hidden forces within us (p. 65) but denies there exists a single act of creation. He later suggests that creative feelings and ideas are "eruptions out of the animal and vegetative faculties that the rational part of us cannot fathom" (p. 68). Throughout this chapter readers might expect Singer, situated as he is at MIT, to connect more with recent work in cognitive science. His treatment of both dreams and emotion disappoints in this respect.

To clear the theoretical terrain, Singer devotes a chapter to dismissing three myths or shibboleths: those characterizing creativity as (1) regression (Freud), (2) communication (Tolstoy), and (3) revealed individuality (Bergson). Singer interprets Freud as reducing all artistic creativity to wish fulfillment and objects to his "hopelessly reductive" assumption of a single model for all art (p. 84). Singer rejects Tolstoy's approach because most artists are not driven by a desire to communicate their feelings (p. 96). The theory he extracts from Bergson also falls flat.

Singer next turns to the question of whether aesthetic creativity is paradigmatic of all creativity. This issue comes to the fore in Chapter 5. Singer identifies three factors at play in any art form -- the artist's effort, the audience's imaginative response, and the material entity that mediates between them (p. 104) -- and argues that each has a creative dimension. In analyzing creative activity, Singer seeks to chart a middle course between Platonic and Romantic theories. The former take the product of art to be too rational -- the copying of pre-existing models (ultimately, the Forms), while the latter overlook the deliberate and constant element of control, "reflective criticism" (p. 123), that the artist exerts. Singer draws a useful distinction between representation and imitation in his account of Plato, and he draws on Dewey to temper the romantic account's excessive freedom.

One other task that occupies Singer here is an extended critique of the Art for Art's Sake view that he claims arose in the nineteenth century. For Singer, the proponents of this view champion aesthetic creativity without requiring that it be didactic or uplifting (p. 111). Returning to the competing strains present in Plato's accounts in the Ion and the Republic, Singer advocates a middle road that acknowledges that aesthetic creativity "depends upon intelligence commingled with imagination" (p. 129). But Singer's goal is much more ambitious than providing some narrow account of artistic creativity. He aims to indicate the creative dimension in each and every human endeavor. Accordingly, he devotes his closing chapters to an examination of the workings of creativity in a number of applied areas: metaphor, myth, humor, the everyday, professional practice, science, technology, and mathematics.

Singer characterizes both metaphor and myth as all-pervasive and as employing creativity on the part of both those who formulate and those who receive and process them. In a chapter on humor, Singer proposes that it arises from a juxtaposition of the prosaic and the absurd. Grounding his analysis in Camus's Myth of Sisyphus, Singer presents and explains a number of jokes to support his account (pp. 163ff.). He then segues to the prosaic/absurd juxtaposition at work in the metaphysics of both Kant and Hume. He closes in scattershot manner, rejecting Bergson's theory of comedy, characterizing the absurdity of dreams, and lastly comparing and contrasting comedy and drama.

The next chapter seems equally fragmented. Singer begins by characterizing the professions. He situates their creativity in the fact that they pursue valuational goals that must be applied in ever-changing circumstances (p. 188). He then examines one case study, doctor-assisted suicide, in considerable detail. Singer elucidates two competing perspectives in play here -- preserving life vs. acceding to patient demands -- and accuses both of "neglecting the creative component in the actual situations that doctors generally face" (p. 193). After considerable discussion, it emerges that medicine is, for Singer, a paradigm of all morality. The unifying creative challenge across this domain is the quest to make life meaningful. Singer turns to Sartre's famous anecdote about the young Parisian choosing between joining the Resistance and caring for his mother. The moral we are meant to extract is that creativity plays a crucial role in practical decision-making. It selects and reconfigures the protagonist's jumble of reasons and feelings in a way that is transformative. So we arrive once again at Singer's baseline characterization of creativity.

In the next of his 'applied' chapters, Singer examines the creativity at work in science and technology. He takes as his springboard Poincaré's account and proposes that a distinction between scientific and aesthetic truth can be based on Poincaré's distinction between intellectual and sensory beauty. Singer endorses Poincaré's approach in lieu of Freud's because it situates the unconscious "within the peripheries of ordinary consciousness," akin to unmindfulness (p. 221) rather than assuming a hidden region of the mind. He closes his discussion with a look at the role of analogies and thought experiments in science. He claims that the most creative analogies in either art or science are "those that are the most extreme, most surprising in their mode of unifying different domains" (p. 237). Nevertheless, he maintains that creativity operates differently in these realms, as scientific discoveries are "generally impersonal" while in the arts the personal vision of the artist is "both paramount and freely expressed beyond any preestablished limits" (p. 239).

Singer defends an overarching negative thesis in his chapter on science, namely, that scientists are "deluding themselves" if they think they'll one day attain complete knowledge of reality (p. 222). Nevertheless, scientists are obliged to organize their findings into coherent and functional structures; herein lies the creativity of their enterprise. I believe it is in light of this assessment of science's ultimate limitations that Singer devotes his closing chapter, "Creativity and Reality," to delimiting the nature and origins of our feeling of reality. He draws on William James and others (Aristotle, Hume, and the present-day philosopher Kathleen Wider!) to pin down this special affective stance. He proposes "a conglomerate of feelings about one or another event or circumstance [upon which] we have rendered the valued category of being real" (pp. 245-6) and declares that "this feeling is not something that automatically issues from the mere occurrence of consciousness but rather embodies a separate act of creativity on our part" (p. 248). Singer explores a pendant conglomerate, the feeling of unreality (pp. 250 ff.), and diagnoses it as arising from "a deficiency in potential creativity" (p. 253). Gesturing back at his previous writings on love, which he takes to be "creative by its very nature" (p. 255), he rejects Platonic, Romantic, and Nietzschean outlooks to ringingly conclude that "the aesthetic pervades the mode of creativity that underlies our feelings about reality. Attending to something or someone as truly real . . . is a creative act in itself" (p. 258).

Thus Singer in the end repeats his opening theme of transformation, ascribing it now to our ongoing creation of reality: "'reality' . . . turns out to be a synoptic term for referring to the endless ways in which everything is what it is because of its being a transformation of whatever has preceded it" (p. 265). A corollary of this view is the claim that no fixed or definite reality exists. Our feelings of reality structure what is there, but this includes "the element of alteration, changing through some flexile process a preestablished pattern that is rendered malleable by surperimposed imagination and creativity" (p. 266). Singer goes on to claim that this transformative brand of creativity is exemplified by the nature of love, which combines two valuational phenomena, affective bestowal and appraisal, which require creative leaps. Singer ends with a brief discussion of the creativity inherent in human reproduction as well as the promise of new cognitive and neurobiological research (p. 269).

Modes of Creativity ends puzzlingly with a 17 page Appendix, "On Creativity," by Moreland Perkins. The Appendix is quite different in tone from the rest of Singer's book. Perkins offers a conceptual analysis of creativity in terms of making something new, unique, and valuable; he adds the requirement that a creative person makes the problem her own (as well as the method, the medium, and the standards) (p. 279). Since his account calls for disciplined mastery, Perkins takes time to argue that it does not rule out the attribution of creativity to children.

Overall, I cannot say I feel positively transformed by my traversal of Singer's book. The author's range and erudition are on display throughout. The approach he has selected would generate a heady undergraduate course, and I believe Singer offers just that at his home institution. But for a full-fledged theory of creativity, I would have preferred a less grandly metaphysical and more incisive treatment of the topic, one more answerable to the findings of science, the demands of common sense, and the deliverances of everyday life.