Modus Vivendi Liberalism: Theory and Practice

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David McCabe, Modus Vivendi Liberalism: Theory and Practice, Cambridge University Press, 2010, 256pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521119788.

Reviewed by Karsten Fischer, University of Munich


Political concepts are alive as long as their semantics are in flux. This is definitely true in the case of liberalism in regard to both its theoretical and its practical aspects. Indeed, a glance at the transatlantic differences reveals that the political semantics of liberalism are particularly varied. In Europe to describe oneself as "liberal" is to fulfill the inevitable prerequisite for describing oneself, in combination with this label, as being on the "left" or "conservative". In practical politics this state of affairs has led to the development of such concepts as Liberal-conservatism or Left-liberalism. However, as a result, it appears that in Europe liberalism's ubiquity has led to a certain degree of ennui in political theory.

By contrast, in the United States, it is a well known fact that in practical politics to be considered liberal often means that one is also considered to be a wimp. Nevertheless, at the same time, liberalism as a theory is accorded much more attention in the United States than it is in Europe. It therefore comes as no surprise that the latest version of liberalism comes from the new world. Under the title of Modus Vivendi Liberalism, David McCabe asserts that he has written "an alternative defense of liberalism"; "one largely neglected in the tradition, that I believe offers a better chance of generating agreement on the general structure of liberal regimes" (p. 8). He understands his modus vivendi liberalism as an "anti-utopian" (p. 126) project that, up to now, "has been something of a poor cousin within the liberal family" (p. 134), or indeed has been regarded as "something of a black sheep in the extended family of liberal thought" (p. 9).

As a first step to changing this perception, McCabe compiles a list of classical liberalism's failings. In this connection he speaks of "beliefs" such as racism, homophobia, and social Darwinism. On the one hand, "liberal states cannot remain agnostic" (p. 86) toward these positions, but, on the other hand, liberalism lacks sufficient resources to oppose them. But, as McCabe argues, "liberals should not expect tolerance to be costless" (p. 174), and, in order to demonstrate the plausibility of his alternative to classical liberalism, he introduces the topic of the relationship of politics to religion. McCabe is aware that many religions would not accept the notion of value pluralism and would insist instead that there is only one correct way to live, including that way of life's narrow notion of virtues and goods. But "if pluralism is true, those ways of life reflect a (partly) mistaken vision of the good" (p. 109). With this statement McCabe's approach is made explicit: The appeal to a modus vivendi liberalism involves a conscious ambiguity. On the one hand it designates a liberalism of "live and let live" (cf. p. 224) that is to guarantee a modus vivendi between equally legitimate forms of life, but on the other hand it wishes to promote a liberalism that in itself provides for a modus vivendi in the literal sense of a good way of life.

This is the point at which McCabe's attack on classical liberalism begins, for the latter banned such questions from public discussion and reduced them to purely private matters. It did so in order to prevent the emergence of potentially unresolvable social conflicts. This solution had the great advantage that as private convictions these same questions enjoyed the protection of the value neutral state. In this regard, in Passions and Constraints: On the Theory of Liberal Democracy, Stephen Holmes introduced the concept of gag rules, the application of which aims to "preclude cooperation-shattering debate of emotionally charged issues".[1] Regrettably, Holmes' important book does not appear in the extremely short bibliography which McCabe obviously believes is sufficient to support his book. Thus, in addition to the fact that the international discussion of the theme is not present in his bibliography, with the absence of Holmes' book an essential anglophone work has also been overlooked, and it is not the only one.

Instead of using such a principle as "gag rules", McCabe opts for extending "the principle of state neutrality that many see as epitomizing the liberal model of politics" (p. 4) into a position that he calls "pluralist perfectionism" (p. 116). This position, despite pluralist tolerance in regard to the "pornographer and cult groupie", promotes traditional values such as "spirituality, family life and aesthetic engagement" (p. 117). McCabe exemplifies the current relevance of this approach on the issue of climate change. An understanding of climate change is dependent on the knowledge of the theory of evolution which, however, is incompatible with certain religious doctrines. But in order to make rational political decisions on the important issue of the environment, knowledge of the theory of evolution is indispensable (p. 233).

One may well agree with the result of McCabe's thought, and also agree, as the author concedes, that such agreement may be found on the basis of classical liberalism. However, the theoretical process by which McCabe arrives at his conclusion is less convincing, for he does not emphasize the rationality of political decisions. Indeed he criticizes the rational aspect of liberalism (p. 48) – without, however, adequately drawing the line against an illiberal variation, as, for example, that developed by Paul W. Kahn in Putting Liberalism in its Place (another work McCabe does not refer to).[2] McCabe has only hinted at the nature of his alternative to liberal rationalism. But what is it to look like, if it is to avoid arriving, as Kahn does, at Carl Schmitt's voluntaristic concept that politics -‑ always and inevitably ‑- consists of acts of the will, and that, for this reason, liberalism, with its claim to having a rational foundation, only contributes to the denaturation of politics? In Schmitt's view liberalism's orientation toward the rational calculation of utility and the individual pursuit of happiness is not a framework in which sacrificial acts can be understood, let alone justified.[3] This type of thought is completely alien to McCabe, but for that reason it would have been better for him not to have toyed with such anti-liberal stereotypes as the critique of rationalism.[4]

McCabe's purpose is to "bolster the view that considerations of well-being are ineluctably relevant in political argument" (p. 12). Indeed, because McCabe believes that our world has "an objective structure of value" (p. 21, cf. p. 25), he designates reflection on the conditions for improving human well-being as the central task of political theory and philosophy (pp. 13, 15, 116). Such reflection should enable a society, at one and the same time, to resist "relativism, subjectivism, and skepticism" and to identify aspects of the good life, which is characterized by "engagement in worthwhile activities, relationships, and experiences" (p. 14). Here McCabe comes close to communitarian thought, in so far as he, like Michael Walzer, postulates incontestable "requirements of thin morality", such as the center of human rights, and presents modus vivendi liberalism as a "commitment to minimal moral universalism" (p. 138). But it is precisely at this point that the supposedly "objective structure of value" should have been given its theoretical foundation (something McCabe does not do). Had he done so he could have also addressed Rorty's liberal argument that there is a priority of democracy to philosophy and that therefore democracy also takes priority before moral discourses on value structures.[5]

McCabe finds his most important source of support in Joseph Raz, whose "defense of liberalism, indeed, his political theory in toto, revolves around human well-being" (p. 57). From here he makes a quite surprising connection to Judith N. Shklar and her concept of a liberalism of fear, which McCabe also sees as part of his "anti-utopian" modus vivendi liberalism (pp. 72, 126). What he ignores in this reference to the fear of cruelty, and to the state as potentially the greatest purveyor of violence ‑- and therefore the danger against which liberal rights must be most vigorously defended (p. 127) ‑- is the fact that Shklar's point is that the liberalism of fear must be further developed into the liberalism of rights. Therefore it is unfair, and simply absurd, for McCabe to say that Shklar "ignored the prior goods -- self-respect and self-esteem, the sense of membership within a respected cultural group -- that enable individuals to see those aims and projects as worth pursuing in the first place"; and, further, that such goods are "significantly shaped by interactions occurring in civil society and so not guaranteed by the liberal state Shklar recommends" (p. 131). In reality these prior goods are essential components not only of Shklar's reconstruction of the step from the liberalism of fear to the liberalism of rights, but also of her study of injustice.[6]

These weaknesses in McCabe's argument are presumably the result of his unconvincing distinction between political liberalism and pluralist liberalism, and between a universalist case and a particularist case of liberal autonomy. For, in the end, political liberalism always implies pluralism, and a particularist case of liberal autonomy is a contradictio in adiecto. Thus, following his criticism of Shklar, he also criticizes John Rawls' Political Liberalism, which, in contrast to the Theory of Justice, pursues "explicitly particularist aims" (p. 77). He therefore maintains that Rawls' reason-oriented model, which rules out "substantive ideas of the good" (p. 78), fails because it cannot "defend the liberal state against the critic who believes that the exercise of reason can yield knowledge about the objective values central to well-being" (p. 79, cf. p. 83). However, this argument, which is made in order to praise any concept of the good life as a public use of reason, and which is presented as an objection to Rawls, is no more than a μετάβασις εἰς ἄλλο γένος. It attributes a position to Rawls that, for very good reasons, he never took. In fact Rawls distinguished between notions of the good life and the public use of reason because there is no need to subject private views to the criteria of rationality. But to attribute to Rawls a position that he very clearly rejected for its inconsistency, and then to turn this inconsistency into a point of criticism against Rawls, is a rather loose way to proceed.

Even more curious are the arguments that McCabe uses in his attempt to closely connect his theoretical foundation of liberalism with a conception of the good life. Thus he writes:

Nothing I have said implies that all illiberal societies provide adequate conditions for their citizens to achieve threshold autonomy. All I have argued is that there is no reason to deny that some of them can do so. That conclusion is enough to defeat autonomy-based liberalism (p. 53).

Here the logical conclusion McCabe draws is as insufficient as the statement that in empirical reality we find illiberal societies which grant an autonomy that is in some ways comparable to the autonomy found in liberal societies. For McCabe neither offers a logical argument to show how this hypothetical possibility -- that some illiberal societies could provide adequate conditions for their citizens to achieve threshold autonomy -- could be considered a refutation of autonomy-based liberalism, nor does he offer convincing empirical evidence that any illiberal society was ever able to provide adequate conditions for autonomy. However, in political philosophy a minimum of empirical social science plausibility is absolutely necessary, and its absence at this point in McCabe's argument is sorely felt.

At the end of the book, it becomes clear that McCabe obviously has in mind other notions of the tests that the liberal state must pass in order to survive than those he mentioned at the beginning, such as racism, homophobia, and social Darwinism. It is his view that the extent to which "integration may be achieved compatible with preserving a culture's distinct practices will in large part be a function of how accommodating liberal regimes will be" (p. 76), for

cultural groups, with their obvious potential to shape deeply the inner lives of liberal citizens, present a serious challenge to the liberal state: for while they may produce citizens who object to liberal commitments, the importance of expressive liberty means liberal states must tolerate those efforts to some substantial degree (p. 166).

In this regard, McCabe claims that in his modus vivendi liberalism "only one norm … prevails: the value of people's freedom to lead their lives as they choose under ideals they embrace" (p. 170). Thus modus vivendi liberalism is based on the gamble

that citizens will tolerate others' having broad liberties and accept that state power will not be used to advance their particular normative framework, in exchange for the assurance that their own liberties will be protected and that neither they nor their children will be subject to paternalist measures reflecting norms they reject (p. 133).

This hardly amounts to more than a reformulation of the classic liberal perspective, albeit under the false point of view that in the liberal state there are cultural group-rights worthy of being protected. For the truth is that the liberal state only recognizes individual rights and believes that it is important to defend these against any group's claim that it has a right to defend its culture against dissenting individuals. In the liberal state there can be no protection of species for forms of cultural life.

McCabe believes, and supposedly without being "nostalgic for some lost spirit of Gemeinschaft", that "citizens can deal with common challenges more efficiently and harmoniously the more they share common goals and values" (pp. 144-5). Consequently, in the modus vivendi liberal state he is in favor of making important civic virtues the subjects of compulsory education. Among the virtues he names are "a concern for the public good", "the capacity for critical deliberation", "a desire to participate in collective political decisions", "a desire for civic engagement that sustains justice", and "tolerance of others' ways of life" (pp. 217-9). He refers to this method as "a robust liberal education" (p. 197) that should enable children to learn alternative ways of thinking. In this regard he believes that the following skills and knowledge should be taught: "Skills of interpreting the products of the human world (including contributions in the arts and sciences)", "skills of abstract reasoning, critical thought, and numerical literacy", "knowledge of the diversity of the natural world and of major views governing scientific thinking in those areas", "knowledge of major events in human history", and "knowledge of the various forms human communities have taken across time and space" (pp. 198-9).

McCabe views this as robust liberal education's contribution "to individual well-being" (p. 213), on the basis of which the civic virtue that supports the liberal state can be built. The liberal state that would fail to introduce compulsory education would be powerless in regard to the prerequisites of its own existence. After all, it is impermissible to simply put "loyalty drugs in the water" (p. 226). Without a "directed education" the liberal state cannot establish contact to the great number of its citizens who "insist that important virtues can be both grounded and broadly motivating only if rooted in some specific metaphysical framework" (p. 210). Unfortunately for this reflection too, one can only say that a similar argument has been made before, and in a far more differentiated way than McCabe has made it, in a book by Ernst-Wolfgang Böckenförde, of which McCabe has taken no notice. In making his argument Böckenförde was guided by the healthy skeptical question of whether the republican ideal of political virtue is really compatible with a willingness to tolerate different ways of life. It was his point that, in the interest of freedom, the liberal secular state has taken a gamble that cannot be hedged by means of legal compulsion and authoritative command.[7]

McCabe could have saved himself the trouble of attributing this insight exclusively to the state of his modus vivendi liberalism in order "to secure its citizens' freedom" instead of constraining those freedoms in order "to ensure its own survival"; a measure he refers to as "the political equivalent of destroying the village to save it." (p. 230). In regard to this issue the idea of a militant democracy could have helped McCabe to reach a less superficial judgment.

Not even the problem that people "fail in important ways to author their own lives" (p. 29, cf. p. 31) is capable of discrediting classical liberalism in McCabe's eyes, in so far as he assumes, along with Brian Barry, that for those who do not know how to use their freedom, alcohol, tranquilizers, TV, and psychoanalysis are available (p. 40).[8] In fact, classical liberalism takes quite the opposite view: McCabe could have learned from Stephen Holmes that "liberal democracy presupposes the existence of the state" and particular "facilitative functions of state power" exist in order to make the enjoyment of freedom possible,[9] without however the state having to become "more active in directing citizens towards specific virtues and goals" -‑ something McCabe (p. 133), in a less liberal spirit, has called for.

All in all McCabe's book offers more arguments for classical liberalism than it does for its own modus vivendi liberalism. This may be due to the fact that it draws on the relevant literature in such a highly selective manner. For, as the German historian Hermann Heimpel once remarked: a careful study of the literature protects one from making discoveries. However, at the same time, McCabe's book is a stimulating work for those of the classical liberal persuasion who can take the weaknesses of his argument as evidence for the strength of their own.

[1] Stephen Holmes: Passions and Constraints. On the Theory of Liberal Democracy, Chicago/London: The University of Chicago Press 1995, p. 10.

[2] Paul W. Kahn: Putting Liberalism in its Place, Princeton: Princeton University Press 2004.

[3] Carl Schmitt: The Concept of the Political, transl. by George Schwab, New Brunswick: Rutgers University Press 1976, pp. 69ff.

[4] Cf. Stephen Holmes: The Anatomy of Antiliberalism, Cambridge (MA)/London: Harvard University Press 1993.

[5] Richard Rorty: "The priority of democracy to philosophy", in: Objectivity, Relativism, and Truth, Cambridge etc.: Cambridge University Press 1991, pp. 175-196.

[6] Judith N. Shklar: Ordinary Vices, Cambridge (MA): The Belknap Press of Harvard University Press 1984; Judith N. Shklar: The Faces of Injustice, New Haven: Yale University Press 1992.

[7] Ernst-Wolfgang Böckenförde: State, Society, and Liberty: Studies in Political Theory and Constitutional Law, New York: Berg 1991.

[8] Brian Barry: The Liberal Idea of Justice, Oxford etc.: Oxford University Press 1973, p. 174.

[9] Holmes, Passions and Constraints, op. cit. (supra note 1), pp. 100, 262.