Molinism: The Contemporary Debate

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Ken Perszyk (ed.), Molinism: The Contemporary Debate, Oxford University Press, 2012, 296pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199590629.

Reviewed by Jonathan L. Kvanvig, Baylor University


There is a special, negative emotion one gets on search committees and graduate admissions committees when facing the prospect of reading one more writing sample entitled "Hume on Miracles." I worried that a new round of papers on Molinism might induce the same feeling; after all, the included bibliography of material on Molinism since 1974 runs to 15 pages in length, so one might reasonably wonder whether we've had enough on this topic.  But I was instead pleasantly surprised by the quality and originality shown in this volume. It is, by any reasonable standard, a superb collection of papers.

The book arose from a three-day workshop on Molinism at Victoria University of Wellington in June of 2008. Some of the entries were presented at the workshop and others were written to supplement those presentations. The collection consists of a fairly extensive introduction by Perszyk on the state of the debate concerning Molinism prior to the conference and a summary of the entries in the collection, together with sixteen articles and a valuable bibliography.

The volume opens with papers by William Hasker and Thomas P. Flint aimed at summarizing the state of the debate on Molinism. Next are four papers involving Trenton Merricks: an initial article by Merricks, entitled "Truth and Molinism," critical comments on the article by William Hasker and Dean Zimmerman ("Trenton Merricks on Some Anti-Molinist Arguments" and "Pro Haskeris Contradictione", respectively), and a reply by Merricks ("Replies to Hasker and Zimmerman").

There is another group of related articles, centered on Dean Zimmerman's  2009 "Yet Another Anti-Molinist Argument."[1] .This group begins with Zimmerman's brief summary of his article ("A Précis of 'Yet Another Anti-Molinist Argument'"), followed by an extensive reply to Zimmerman by William Lane Craig ("Yet Another Failed Anti-Molinist Argument") and Zimmerman's response to Craig ("An Anti-Molinist Replies").

Three other entries focus on the problem of evil, defending perspectives that differ significantly from Molinism. Hugh J. McCann, in "The Free Will Defense", summarizes what we have learned about the difficulties involved in the free will defense and extends criticism of it, arguing that Molinism cannot succeed because it can offer no good explanation of the justification God needs in order to know counterfactuals of freedom. Derk Pereboom defends the hard determinist version of theological determinism in "Theological Determinism and Divine Providence," and William Hasker, in "An Open Theist Theodicy of Natural Evil," presents what he terms a "natural order theodicy" and argues that it is a theodicy available only to those positions such as Open Theism that involve a risk-taking conception of God.

The volume also contains five other papers. Thomas P. Flint, in "Molinism and Incarnation," investigates the idea of multiple incarnations, specifically, the idea that the beatific vision involves the union of each of our individual human natures with the second person of the Trinity, concluding that the view is not obviously defective. Edward Wierenga, in "Tilting atMolinism," refines his position on counterfactuals of freedom so that they are not counterfactuals of world-actualization but rather counterfactuals of initial segments of a world, and uses the refined account to reply to challenges to Molinism by Perszyk and van Inwagen. John Martin Fischer, in "Putting Molinism in Its Place," continues his argument to the effect that Molinism, while an interesting theory of divine providence, is incapable of offering a reply to the freedom/foreknowledge problem. Greg Restall's entry "Molinism and the Thin Red Line" is an intriguing presentation of various models in tense logic and the difficulties involved in each, concluding that the difficulties for a branching node model raise deep difficulties for the Molinist commitment to counterfactuals of freedom. And Edwin Mares and Ken Persyk aim to sort out the relationship between counterfactuals of freedom and the standard Lewis/Stalnaker semantics for counterfactuals in "Molinist Conditionals." They distinguish the semantical issue of the truth conditions for counterfactuals and the metaphysical issue of their truth-makers, concluding that this distinction allows Molinism to address adequately two popular anti-Molinist semantical arguments.

One valuable feature of the volume is its mix of articles, some for those with little familiarity with the Molinist debates, others for those with a thorough background in the area. For those unfamiliar with the issues, the articles by McCann and Pereboom, as well as the last Hasker article, provide useful entry points. For those more familiar with the literature, the articles by Mares and Perszyk, Wierenga, and the Merricks contribution and discussion shed new light on most of the long-standing issues. Finally, new issues arise in the Zimmerman-Craig exchange, in the Fischer piece, and in the Restall piece connecting Molinism with work in tense logic.

In a relatively short review, it isn't possible to write in any detail about all of the interesting material here, so I will focus on the latter three pieces to give a sense of the new issues raised. In the Zimmerman-Craig exchange two issues are central. The first is the centrality of the Recombination Principle in Zimmerman's argument, according to which "every (strictly) consistent combination of counterfactuals of creaturely freedom constitutes a possible world-type for God." (p. 149) Zimmerman had argued that Plantinga and other Molinists assume this principle, and the success of his anti-Molinist argument rests on it. Craig demurs, citing Michael Bergmann, Daniel Howard-Snyder, and John Hawthorne as deniers.[2] Zimmerman reiterates the basis of his endorsement of the Recombination Principle: "I took myself to be arriving at the possibility of extreme combinations of CFs [counterfactuals of freedom] by the same kind of recombination principles that allowed Molinists to use Plantinga's Free Will Defense" (p. 171) On this score, I think Craig is right. What is true is that the Recombination Principle is perhaps the most natural, fully general explanation of the kinds of inferences typically used by Molinists, but there is no need to endorse recombinations in such full generality to sustain the particular uses in the Molinist literature. But Zimmerman's point still has probative value, because if Molinists aren't relying on the fully general Recombination Principle, they should tell us what restricted principle they are using.

The central challenge posed by Zimmerman's argument involves the possibility of extreme transworld manipulability -- that small and seemingly insignificant differences between worlds might reverse the counterfactuals of freedom true in those worlds. Zimmerman's strongest appeal here is to the kind of control that involves imperceptible, small, and remote differences in total circumstances, concluding that if he were under such complete control, he would not be a free agent at all. Here is where the discussion needs to focus, for Zimmerman endorses an account of freedom on which my behavior isn't free if under the control (causal or non-causal) of another person, while Craig focuses on the issue of whether the behavior is "up to me". One of the insights to be gleaned from Zimmerman's new argument is that Open Theists and Molinists may not be the fellow travelers concerning human freedom that the standard category scheme of Theological Determinism/Molinism/Open Theism supposes. Perhaps Molinists are closer to compatibilists than we have been thinking, at least on this point concerning external manipulability.

Restall's piece raises an important concern for Molinists as well. Restall borrows an argument from Belnap and Green,[3] an argument intended to show that a branching model of time containing a "thin red line" to pick out the actual future from all the merely possible ones cannot sustain the logical truth that if a claim is true, it has always been that it will be true. The argument can be stated quite simply. Suppose that actual history has gotten to point a, and that from this point, two branches are possible: one to point b and the other to point c. Suppose further that the thin red line goes to point b -- that is suppose, at a, it will be the case that b. So, once we get to point b, it is true that it was the case that it will be the case that b. But then this same truth is present from the perspective of point c as well, since a is in the past relative to both possible futures, b and c. But, since from the perspective of point c, it was the case that it will be the case that b, we get a violation of the logical truth in question. Restall concludes, "If we wish to get the logic of our assertions right (granted a branching time understanding of moments) then the thin red line through a moment is completely inert in evaluating statements of the form [it will be the case that] p." (p. 234)

What is interesting in the present context is the way in which standard Molinism, as well as Ockhamism, have replies ready at hand. Standard Molinism insists that what is true at past times is in part a function of what happens at later times. Molinists don't need to claim that we have causal power over the past, but they do hold that we have counterfactual power over the past. And Ockhamists embrace something similar with their distinction between hard and soft facts. In each case, it is essential to these viewpoints that there be feedback loops from the future to the past, and for both positions, paradigm examples of such affected claims include statements such as "it was the case that it will be the case that p."

But the challenge presented by Restall remains, since Molinists have not worked out what kind of tense logic can fit with their commitments. The Restall challenge is that work in tense logic suggests difficulties that can only be solved by rolling up the sleeves and showing how to do a tense logic that comports with the kind of temporal feedback loops thatMolinism requires.

Fischer's new criticism of Molinism is similarly suggestive. He argues that Molinism presupposes an answer to Pike's argument for the incompatibility of freedom and foreknowledge, rather than providing an answer to it. Positions that address the argument directly include Ockhamism (with its hard/soft fact distinction) and positions that deny the possibility of foreknowledge (including Eternalism and various positions on the nature of truth that deny that future-tense statements can have the truth-value required by knowledge). Fischer's complaint against Molinism is that it can't provide a response to the argument for incompatibilism without begging the question:

It should be clear that in the dialectical context (in which the incompatibilist's Basic Argument is under consideration), it would be question-begging (or at least not dialectically helpful at all) simply to forward (without explanation) the claim that God does know in advance truths of the form 'At some future time agent A will be free to do other than he actually does (X).' This simply posits that in the actual world God knows in advance that some human agent will in fact be free to do otherwise; but this is precisely what is called into question by the Basic Argument. I contend that it would be similarly question-begging (or at least not dialectically helpful at all) to claim that God can know in advance truths of the form 'If agent A were in (possible) circumstances C1A would be free to do other than he actually does (X).' (pp. 213-214).

There are several points here at which Molinists might balk. First, it isn't clear why we are talking about rhetorical fallacies when evaluating philosophical arguments. For example, in considering arguments for skepticism, it is one thing to offer a rhetorically permissible response to the skeptic and quite another to offer an objection to the argument for skepticism. Even a fully adequate response to the argument need not be rhetorically permissible in a debate with a defender of the argument.

Of course, this point won't settle the issue, since the fundamental issue isn't whether some kind of rhetorical fallacy has been committed, but whether Molinism is a response to the argument for incompatibilism. Here there is both a substantial and an insubstantial issue. The insubstantial one arises when we focus on the question of what it takes to offer a responseto an argument. Here's one view: to respond to an argument is to target a specific premise and argue that it is false. And Molinism doesn't do that. But there is another sense of response, the kind of response we get from Tarski's theory of truth with respect to the Liar Paradox. It doesn't target a particular premise in the paradox, and argue that the premise is false. It rather develops and argues for a general theoretical structure that implies that some of the premises involved in the paradox are mistaken. And the theoretical structure in question was motivated in large part by the paradox in question, and counts as a response to it in spite of not targeting a specific premise of that paradox.

Viewed this way, Molinism clearly provides a response to the argument for incompatibilism. It develops a general theoretical structure, and notes that it implies that at least one of the premises in the argument for incompatibilism is false. Molinism begins by introducing the idea of a counterfactual of freedom from ordinary life and circumstances, noting that we rely on the ability to predict and control the behavior of other people just as much as we rely on some grasp of the laws of nature to predict and control the behavior of nature. Molinistsalso embrace a libertarian account of freedom, and then point out that there is no obvious perceived conflict between such freedom and such an ability. They then generalize this point to explain God's ability to predict and control everything. The result is a general theoretical structure which is claimed to have independent motivation and which is motivated by the argument for incompatibilism.

There remains a problem, however, because Molinists have not explained how God is capable, prior to creation, of having middle knowledge; they have merely posited that he does. And perhaps it is in this sense that their response to the argument for incompatibilism is defective or question-begging or dialectically ineffective. But if that is true, it is equally true that Molinism is defective as a theory of providence, and central to Fischer's complaint is that Molinism should be put in its proper place as a serious competitor regarding divine providence. But if a failure to explain how such knowledge is possible is a defect in responding to the argument for incompatibilism, it isn't clear why it's not a defect in a theory of providence as well.[4]

The depth and significance of these new issues are one mark of the quality of the articles in this volume. In short, the collection is required reading for anyone working on Molinism in the future and can also be used effectively to gain a perspective on Molinism itself and the debates surrounding it of the last thirty years or so.

[1] Dean Zimmerman, "Yet Another Anti-Molinist Argument," in Samuel Newlands and Larry M. Jorgensen, eds., Metaphysics and the Good:  Themes from the Philosophy of Robert Merrihew Adams, (Oxford:  Oxford University Press, 2009), pp. 33-94.

[2] Michael Bergmann, "Might-Counterfactuals, Transworld Untrustworthiness, and Plantinga’s Free Will Defense," Faith and Philosophy 16 (1999), pp. 336-351; Daniel Howard-Snyder and John O’Leary-Hawthorne, "Transworld Sanctity and Plantinga’s Free Will Defense," International Journal for Philosophy of Religion 44 (1998), pp. 1-21.

[3] Nuel Belnap and Mitchell Green, "Indeterminism and the Thin Red Line," Philosophical Perspectives 8 (Logic and Language (1994)), pp. 365-388.

[4] I don’t believe, however, that such a failure is a failure in a theory of providence.  For argument to this effect, see my "An Epistemic Theory of Creation," Destiny and Deliberation, (Oxford:  Oxford University Press, 2011).