Money and the Early Greek Mind: Homer, Philosophy, Tragedy

Placeholder book cover

Seaford, Richard, Money and the Early Greek Mind: Homer, Philosophy, Tragedy, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 382pp, $28.99 (pbk), ISBN 0521539927.

Reviewed by Joshua Reynolds, Northwestern University


Seaford’s book deals with the origins of Greek philosophy. According to the author, its purpose is to explain “the advent of the idea of the universe as an intelligible order subject to the uniformity of impersonal power. More specifically… [to explain] the counter-intuitive idea of a single substance underlying the plurality of things manifest to the senses” (175, emphasis in original). The author thus intends to focus not on explicating the beliefs and arguments of early Greek philosophers, but rather on ascertaining “why… they [held] those extraordinary fundamental beliefs about the world” (10, emphasis in original). Seaford finds his explanation in the rapid development and pervasive use of coined money in Greece during the sixth century B.C.

The second chapter begins Seaford’s study with an examination of the various types of economic transaction in Homer. The author argues that the main type of transaction in Homeric society is reciprocity, the voluntary exchange of goods (especially gifts) and services for the purpose of establishing or maintaining interpersonal relationships. Seaford points out that Homeric poetry idealizes such personal transactions, while it marginalizes the impersonal practices of trade and monetary exchange. But at the same time, Seaford argues, the poems also reflect an ideology that is at odds with reciprocal transactions. In this “crisis of reciprocity,” unequally distributed gifts often prove ineffective and even produce discord (34ff.). Seaford contrasts this failure with Homer’s depictions of the success of the ritual of sacrificial distribution, in which all participants receive an equal share of meat.

Chapters three and four show how, historically, the model of sacrificial distribution eventually predominates over the reciprocal model. Seaford begins by elaborating Homer’s inconsistent ideologies. On the one hand, Homeric society idealizes the gift-exchange of prestige objects, which may endure through time as permanent reminders of heroic achievements. On the other hand, sacrificial distribution in Homer generates an “ordered communality,” as opposed to the discord of reciprocity; but it also fails to leave any permanent material reminders (53; 67). Seaford argues that the development of the polis transcended these contradictions by synthesizing the communality of animal sacrifice with the permanence and substitutability of prestige objects (67). He presents as an example of this synthesis the durable figurines symbolizing sacrificial animals that begin to appear in abundance as temple offerings during the eighth century (66). Seaford later contrasts Homeric society with the Mesopotamian institutions reflected in the Epic of Gilgamesh and the Enuma Elish in order to show that the Greek temple was distinctive in combining the storage of durable wealth with the egalitarian distribution of sacrificial meat (76).

The sixth chapter is significant because it connects Seaford’s earlier discussion of Greek animal sacrifice to the beginnings of coinage. An important link here, Seaford explains, was the sanctuary. In order to provide a communal sacrifice, the sanctuary must receive durable contributions, such as non-perishable figurines, fees, etc. (110). The security of the sanctuary allowed it to redistribute its precious metal, usually as payments for services. This practice, Seaford argues, “derived at least in part from the ancient… notion of the universal right to a share of sacrificial meat, carried over into pieces of metal that, just like the meat, would have to be in small pieces of standard size and quality, acceptably equal for all” (110). Seaford goes on to argue that the entry of precious metal into communal sacrificial distributions originally was responsible for the subsequent collective confidence in the guarantee of the value of coins (113). But the mark on a coin reinforced and eventually replaced the role of sacrificial ritual in generating collective confidence (113). This mark, Seaford observes, authenticates the substance into which it is impressed by imposing on it a form, or sign (119). On the author’s analysis, this sign signifies an “ideal substance which… belongs to a new kind of reality, concrete and visible (being metal) and yet (because distinct from the actual metal) abstract and invisible” (120, emphasis in original).

Seaford suggests in chapter seven that the collective recognition of the symbolic value of standardized pieces of durable metal used in sacrificial ritual was responsible for a distinctive feature of Greek coinage, fiduciarity (146). His main argument here is that “the stamp on the earliest coins was not a sign of quality… [or quantity], but rather of redeemability—i.e. of politically (or socially) conferred value. The coin is accepted not merely for its intrinsic value but on trust…” (136). Seaford goes on to argue that the invention and use of the earliest coins necessitated recognition of the antithesis between sign (or form) and substance, “an antithesis in which, although the substance must have some intrinsic value, decisive is the sign, which implies a homogeneous ideal substance distinct from the metal in which the sign is expressed” (136). Seaford eventually goes on to identify the distinctive fiduciary quality of early Greek coinage as the key factor in the philosophical developments of the time (146).

In the eighth chapter, Seaford surveys fifth century texts in which Greek writers express the features of coined money “without always explicitly stating or conceptualising them” (147). Among these features, Seaford focuses on the following: money is homogeneous, an “embodiment of the absolute abstract equivalence between commodities imposed by exchange” (149). Money is impersonal, not associated with specific individuals. It is the universal aim of action and a universal means. It is unlimited in power, extent, and in the desire for it. Lastly, money unites opposites and is both concrete (i.e., the intrinsic value) as well as abstract (i.e., the numerical value of a coin, or the “ideal substance”). Seaford’s analysis here serves as the basis of the comparisons he draws later between Greek money and the metaphysical principles of the Presocratics.

The author turns to the rise of Greek metaphysics in chapter nine. Here he criticizes the political explanations of Lloyd and Vernant, who attribute the beginning of cosmology to an unprecedented development of impersonal law, public space, and freedom of public debate in the sixth century. Seaford argues that the city-states in which cosmology began were not exceptional or unprecedented in these respects (182–3). They were, however, unique in their economies. Seaford emphasizes that the Ionians were first to use coinage, and did so at the same time they produced philosophical cosmology. He therefore promises a “cumulative argument, correlating the development of coined money with the development of early Greek cosmology as a whole” (188). His basic explanation is that the Ionians’ material principles and Parmenides’ One are “unconscious projections” of the ideal substance of exchange-value (188–9).

Chapter ten begins Seaford’s cumulative argument. He points here to an extensive analogy between the features of coined money and Anaximander’s principle, the ’unlimited’ (apeiron). For instance, each is unlimited, impersonal, abstract, the source and motivation of all things, and in eternal motion (205–7). Seaford then goes on to consider the origins of Anaximander’s cosmology. He acknowledges that socio-political explanations can account for Anaximander’s appeal to the notions of penalty and justice when he speaks of the “spectacle of opposites… encroaching on each other… within an overall balance and measure” (207). However, Seaford continues, such an explanation is not sufficient for the apeiron because it does not explain the similarity between the apeiron and money. The author adds that even if Anaximander’s cosmos is a projection of socio-political relations then it must also project what is most unprecedented about his time and place: namely, money, as “a substrate of all commercial activity” (208). Seaford elaborates: “just as the socially necessary transcendence… of sacrificial communality and of monarchy must be projected as cosmological transcendence (e.g. Moira and Zeus), the same is true, in our period, of monetary value” (209).

Chapter eleven asks why early Greek cosmologies were monistic. Seaford identifies a combination of factors. Earlier, mythic cosmogonies represent the world as coming to be from a single undifferentiated mass; they thus center on the “emergence of the many out of the one and the reimposition of unity on the many” (224). But Seaford’s explanation goes further than this, as he identifies psychological and socio-political elements as well. Mythic cosmogonies, he argues, reflect the “cosmic projection of the formation of the self,” which is fundamental to mystery cults (220; 223–4). But these cosmogonies also reflect the historical emergence of monarchy and its power to unify diversity (221; 223–4). Philosophical cosmogony differs from the mythic in that it retains the psychological element but abandons the idea of a personal universal power in favor of the impersonality of money. The result, Seaford concludes, “is the unconscious fusion of ideas deriving from mystery cult with the sublimation of monetary value” (230). In particular, the replacement of the socio-political element by the monetary factor “[makes for] a cosmology of impersonal all-underlying substance with a tendency to abstraction” (230).

Chapter twelve explores the views of Heraclitus and Parmenides as examples of such sublimation. Seaford focuses here on the development of abstract being. He explains this concept in terms of the similar notions of money and mind: “Both monetary value and the mind are abstractions, embodied and yet in a sense invisible. Indeed each is a single controlling invisible entity uniting the multiplicity of which it in a sense consists” (242, emphasis in original). Seaford appeals to both of these notions to explain the origins of the antithetical principles of Heraclitus and Parmenides (244–5). On the one hand, Heraclitus’ concern is the relationship between concrete multiplicity and his unitary abstract logos. His logos, Seaford argues, derives from the “mutual reinforcement” between the abstract invisible logos of money and the “invisible unitary self” (244). On the other hand, Parmenides focuses solely on the abstract in his conception of the One. Seaford argues that the aristocratic ideology of the self-sufficiency of the individual, “reinforced and made abstract by the all-pervasive abstraction of money,” was a key factor in Parmenides’ idea of “a single, self-sufficient, impersonal…, unchanging, abstract sphere as all that exists” (247).

Chapter thirteen considers the origins of Pythagoreanism. Seaford argues that we find in the central view attributed to Pythagoras (that ’number is all’) the “sublimation of the concrete plurality inherent in commerce and practical politics, rather than of (as in Parmenides) the separation of unitary abstract value from circulation” (269, emphasis in original). The author also explores in this chapter the origins of Protagoras’ subjectivism. He explains here that early Greek thinkers were aware “that humans unconsciously project themselves or their institutions onto the world” (which Seaford calls “deprojection” or “desublimation”). They were not, however, aware that they themselves had projected monetary value onto the cosmos (284–5). But Protagoras, Seaford suggests, comes close to this awareness in his ’man is the measure’ doctrine. Parmenides’ One represents the sublimation of monetary value abstracted from circulation, and thus implies the distinction between being and seeming. But it was the “deprojection” of monetary value that contributed to Protagoras’ “subjectivist challenge to the distinction between being and seeming” (290–1). Seaford admits that Protagoras also unconsciously projects monetary value onto the cosmos; however, he maintains, this projection focuses on the subjectivity of monetary value, “and so in a sense also deprojects itself” (291).

Overall, Seaford’s book is interesting, insightful, and combines expertise in ancient sources with careful reasoning. It certainly offers an invaluable discussion of the origins and cultural contexts of early Greek philosophy. But Seaford’s concern with the historical explanations of Greek philosophy suggests that his book may not appeal to scholars interested exclusively in the philosophical content and argumentation of Presocratic texts. The author often explicitly minimizes intellectual explanations of a philosopher’s views in favor of socio-political, religious, and psychological factors (219; 253–4; 273). In fact, he insists that comprehending the relevant cultural factors is necessary for understanding Presocratic metaphysics. We must, he maintains, avoid treating ancient philosophy as if it were created in a “historical vacuum” (10), even if this threatens most Presocratic scholars’ “control of their subject and the autonomy of ’doing philosophy’“ (xi). All the same, Seaford’s findings do not offer any crucial understanding of what the Presocratics had to say about the universe, unless, of course, the relevant sense of ’understanding’ is historically explanatory. In fact, Seaford admits that the Presocratics did not conceptualize or express the “sublimated” notion of monetary value that purportedly explains the views they did express. Accordingly, Seaford is not “doing philosophy,” as he seeks the “unconscious” motivations of philosophers’ ideas instead of engaging in a dialogue with those philosophers about the issues they addressed.

As it happens, this is where Seaford’s overall explanation is weakest. He argues that the early philosophers arrived at the idea of the world as a single substance underlying the plurality of sensible things by projecting unconsciously the substance of monetary value onto the cosmos. Thus, the mechanism of projection is as fundamental to Seaford’s thesis as the development and pervasive use of coinage. But Seaford never explains the nature of this mechanism. What he does is to suggest that the invention and use of coinage demanded for the first time the recognition of the antithesis between sign and substance, and thus gave rise to the conception of a homogeneous and unchanging substance (136; cf. 146, 254, 257–8). The resulting “new” notion of signification was one such that the sign authenticates the value of the material into which it is impressed (124; 155 nt. 29). But does this notion really derive from coinage? There are signs in Homer and Hesiod that confirm the value of the subject that they have marked, such as Odysseus’ scar, the spot on the forehead of Diomedes’ victorious horse, or landmarks. Another problem with Seaford’s suggestion is that he simply takes it for granted that early money users must have been aware of the distinction between sign and substance in order to trust the value of coins. But even if Seaford’s suggestion were true, it only tells us how the notion of the distinction between sign and substance came about. It does not reveal how this notion “enters unconsciously into Parmenides’ conception of the One” (257).

The above criticism is not to deny the existence of unconscious projection. But it is safe to say that if the mechanism does exist then it is a complex process with a nature that is no more obvious than the very origins of Greek philosophy. In other words, explanatory principles tend to fail as such if they are not clearer and simpler than what they purport to explain. True, there are interesting, even relevant, parallels between Seaford’s analysis of Greek money and the cosmological principles that our ancient sources attribute to the Presocratics. But in order to show that these philosophers “sublimated” the institution of monetization in their accounts of the universe requires more than just drawing these parallels. It demands clarifying the nature of the process that gives rise to them, and specifying why it is that that particular process must be responsible. Without such clarification, Seaford’s explanation of Greek metaphysics ultimately seems to be no more than a deus ex machina.