Moore's Paradox: New Essays on Belief, Rationality, and the First Person

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Mitchell Green and John N. Williams (eds.), Moore's Paradox: New Essays on Belief, Rationality, and the First Person, Oxford University Press, 2007, 247pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199282791.

Reviewed by Stephen Hetherington, University of New South Wales


1. Few edited philosophy collections have as narrowly defined an initial focus as this one -- in effect, just a few tantalizing lines from G. E. Moore. Those lines intrigued Wittgenstein, along with a sizable number of philosophers since. Was a paradox born? Perhaps; at least a puzzle appeared. Is it easily solvable? Many have believed so. Yet it is still with us; now, too, is this very useful book. It contains diagnoses, dismissals, and displays of the Moorean challenge. And it serves a well-defined philosophical purpose, gathering together a variety of views as to what Moore was really revealing. It does this well.

2. As usually formulated, the Moorean paradox (as I will call it, in deference to the book's title) is the philosophical challenge of understanding what is wrong, maybe absurd, in accepting, asserting, judging, and/or believing sentences that exemplify one or the other of these forms:

(1) p, but I do not believe that p.

(2) p, but I believe that not-p.

(1) is the omissive form of Moore's paradox; (2) is the commissive form (p. 10). Each is somehow and somewhat puzzling. But in what ways, and to what extent, exactly?

3. Most contributors to this volume accept, as both a datum and explanandum, the absurdity of asserting or accepting a Moorean sentence. Then they begin trying to understand the nature of that absurdity. Briefly, here are some of their suggestions.

Claudio de Almeida (ch. 3) diagnoses, in intricate detail, a kind of irrationality -- an epistemic one, in fact a justificatory one, specifically a case of incoherence. Believing a Moorean sentence makes one's belief system incoherent; justificatory implications make this apparent. So, such a belief, even if true, cannot be known, as some simple epistemic logic reveals.

The same is claimed by John Williams (ch. 5), building upon a principle adopted and adapted from Gareth Evans's The Varieties of Reference (Clarendon Press, 1982). To be justified in believing that p is to be justified in believing that one believes that p (p. 95); and to be justified in believing that p is to be justified in believing that one does not believe that not-p (p. 101). Armed with those theses, Williams deduces that Moorean beliefs cannot be epistemically justified. More of relevance ensues, but this is his central result.

In contrast, Thomas Baldwin (ch. 4) bypasses explanations that apply even simple epistemic logic, in favour of an analysis that speaks of normativity, more generally considered. Assertion implies belief, which is one's being committed to the truth of what is asserted. The clash within a Moorean sentence is thus normative, with various, and variously incompatible, commitments being forced to cohabit inside a single assertion. (And much the same is said about Moorean thoughts, not only Moorean assertions.)

Norms feature, too, in Mitchell Green's paper (ch. 9). Moorean sentences, when asserted (whether privately or publicly), manifestly violate some norms of which we are well aware at the relevant times. Which norms? Ones either of sincerity or of rationality (where this amounts to one's aiming to track truth); in either case, norms of assertion.

All of those responses discuss a common core of putative Moorean absurdity. But some of the volume's contributors are wary of assigning the property of Moorean absurdity in the usual way. For instance, Jay Atlas (ch. 6) arrives, on linguistic grounds, at a more restrictive characterization of Moorean sentences. Only when the speaker talks of "I myself" as not believing that p, or as believing that not-p, is there a Moorean sentence; and even then, only when the sentence has this form (p. 136):

(3) I believe that I myself F, but I do not F.

Atlas does not regard "the standard forms of Moore's paradox belief utterances" as "logically or linguistically paradoxical in the first-person content-clause cases, since they would be uttered felicitously by recovering, previously delusional psychiatric patients" (ibid.).

André Gallois (ch. 8), too, does not think of the usual Moorean sentences as being inherently absurd. Moorean absurdity, he argues, is a problem only about some instances of conscious thought. To believe a Moorean absurdity is to give oneself "an unstable view of the world believed in" (p. 187). More particularly, there is an inability to integrate the two believed conjuncts of the Moorean absurdity into a single view of the world.

Jonathan Adler and Bradley Armour-Garb (ch. 7), likewise, highlight an aspect of belief -- its transparency. "For you fully to believe that p is for it to be true that p (from your first-personal point of view)" (pp. 153-4). Then assertion is normatively permitted (p. 157). Except, of course, for Moorean sentences; a category which is argued to be broader than we might have assumed.

Still, there are limits on the category -- as there are on its potential danger. Robert Gordon (ch. 11) delineates a notion of Moorean pretense. There are occasions when we deliberately, even sensibly, adopt Moorean sentences; such as in some sorts of thought experiment. (Descartes, in his Meditation I, is as famous an instance as there is of this: pp. 237-8.) We may even do so as part of making intellectual progress.

Is there ever a prospect of transgressing such limits, though -- and thereby of taking philosophy backwards? Alan Hájek (ch. 10) highlights several examples of philosophers espousing -- and not casually, but in their more careful moments, when presenting their own philosophical views -- what look suspiciously like Moorean sentences. Indeed (he asks), are such sentences unavoidable for philosophers with any humility? Accordingly, we must wonder, where will Moorean absurdity end?

For that matter, where did it begin? Roy Sorensen (ch. 2) provides some clues. Moore himself, suggests Sorensen, noticed Moorean sentences as part of his criticisms of idealism: "In 'The Refutation of Idealism', G. E. Moore concedes that it is difficult to distinguish between things and things as we are conscious of them" (p. 47). But it can be done; and, philosophically, it needs to be done. Moorean sentences emerge from that general project.

4. The editors, Mitchell Green and John Williams, provide a careful and conscientious introduction (ch. 1). They offer a little history, many distinctions, and several pointers to what awaits the reader.

5. The question that is shaped most sharply by this book is the following one: How philosophically central is Moore's paradox? Is it a clear case of the worst of analytic philosophy? Alternatively, does it exemplify the best of such philosophy? Is it a myopic mouse chewing its own tail, blind to a fuller world of larger philosophical issues? Or is it a precisely focused puzzle that leads naturally, and with pleasing exactitude, into a multitude of substantial philosophical questions? Each paper in this book pursues precision; and the aim of the book as a whole, it seems, is partly to show how Moore's paradox is not merely a philosophically isolable curiosity. Does the book succeed in this respect? Overall, I believe so. There are some excellent papers in the book; and a high standard is present throughout, usually striving to link the Moorean sentences with further philosophical issues.

Of course, the book's narrow initial focus makes for more repetition of material than is typical in a collection of philosophy papers on a stated topic. One paper after another rehearses much the same opening Moorean material, which can become slightly tedious. By that same token, though, because there exists this recurring core to the contributions, the papers as a group have a better-than-usual chance of real progress on a particular philosophical topic being made within a single edited volume.

6. I was going to say that I am loath to comment myself on Moore's paradox, now knowing even better than previously (courtesy of this book) that many tempting interpretations or diagnoses of it are available. Yet that same variety encourages me to offer a few words; and so I will, in the next section. Please regard them, even if they fail philosophically, as testament to the stimulating quality and focus of this book.

7. Either the omissive or the commissive form of Moore's paradox uses "believe" as a contrast: "but … believe --". (In (1), there is a "but … do not believe". In (2), there is a "but … believe that not-p".) However, the Moorean sentences, at least when used in speech or thought, do this misleadingly or incompletely. (A few contributors to this volume make clear that the awkward implications arise not from the Moorean sentences per se, but from their being used in various ways.) In semantically well-ordered speech or thought, we do not mean to contrast a belief that not-p, or not believing that p, with a state of affairs p simpliciter. Rather, we mean to compare these with some other cognitive or mental state bearing upon p. (In saying this, I should note, I am taking for granted the Moorean restriction to first-person present-tense formulations.)

For example (using just omissive forms), we may often say or believe such things as these:

(4) Seemingly, p; but I do not believe that p.

(5) There is evidence as of p, but I do not believe that p.

(6) I accept that p, but I do not believe that p.

(7) I know that p, but I do not believe that p.

(4) and (5) contrast evidence with some more or less developed form and strength of belief. Respectively, its seeming that p, or there being evidence that p (in what is perhaps some more general sense), is being contrasted with what is nonetheless a lack of belief as to p. (6) might, for instance, be applying something like L. Jonathan Cohen's detailed distinction between belief and acceptance. (See his An Essay on Belief and Acceptance, Clarendon Press, 1992.) And (7) may be expanded in some such way as this:

Yes, I've been told that p, and I have no reason to doubt it: rationally, I know that p. But I can't yet bring myself to believe that p: I don't want p to be the case.

And, strikingly, none of (4) through (7) are absurd (no matter whether they are believed or judged, etc.). In each of these cases, a putative Moorean absurdity, such as (1) or (2), results only once the first conjunct's cognitive qualifier is removed. Yet it is no coincidence, I am suggesting, that such removal leaves us with a semantic misuse of the "believe"-as-contrast locution. It is no wonder that we find (1) and (2) perplexing. It is no wonder, too, that so many possible explanations of putative Moorean absurdity can arise, with most of these amounting to ways of expanding upon (1) and (2) by adverting to further cognitive stances towards, or expressions of, the first conjunct.

Is there a counterexample to my suggestion, though, in our sometimes being able sensibly to assert or judge that (8)?

(8) p, but I do not know that p.

No, because the "do not know" is not sensibly being used in a way that could be replaced by "do not believe". (8) makes sense only with its second conjunct doing duty for something like "I do not have good enough evidence, in order for my belief that p to constitute knowledge." And "I have good evidence for p, but nevertheless not-p" is not absurd. Neither is "I believe that p, but not on the basis of good enough evidence to make my belief knowledge."

8. I offer those diagnostic suggestions, but with no firm sense of being correct. At best, therefore (in a Moorean spirit), I say this: I am correct -- but without quite believing that I am. I cannot say unqualifiedly, with a disposable confidence, that I am correct. I am confident, however, that this volume from Green and Williams is an extremely helpful source of material with which to begin assessing attempts either to understand or to solve the Moorean paradox.