Moral Aggregation

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Iwao Hirose, Moral Aggregation, Oxford University Press, 2015, 234pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199933686.

Reviewed by Joseph Mendola, University of Nebraska-Lincoln


Aggregation is a controversial feature of certain moral theories. For instance, classical forms of utilitarianism evaluate outcomes by regard to the sums of well-being that they contain. But while such a summation of well-being is perhaps the most familiar form of aggregation of morally relevant factors in ethics, there are others. This book defends an especially abstract form of aggregation, which Iwao Hirose calls 'formal aggregation', and develops applications to intrapersonal cases involving overall judgments of the quality of lives, and to interpersonal cases based on John Taurek's Rescue Case.

Aggregation, in Hirose's sense, is the 'combination of morally relevant factors such as well-being, happiness, pleasure, desire-satisfaction, claims, reasons, and so on, into an objective value.' (23) While the most familiar sort of aggregation is the summation of well-being characteristic of classical utilitarianism, which Hirose calls 'substantive aggregation', he also indicates some other forms. For instance, telic egalitarianism assesses the overall value of outcomes with regard to two factors that are aggregated in an overall judgment: the overall well-being an outcome contains and also the degree of equality of the distribution of that well-being within the outcome. And prioritarianism grants greater weight to contributions to the well-being of the worse-off, but still recognizably aggregates in its overall assessment of outcomes. Hirose is in particular concerned to defend an abstract form of aggregation, which he calls 'formal aggregation', in which the morally relevant factors to be aggregated may not be determinate prior to the aggregation and may emerge only through the aggregation process. To understand this idea, consider one key example: according to John Broome's version of egalitarianism, there is well-being of individuals that is determinate prior to the aggregation process, and it grounds facts about the inequality of well-being. These in turn determine a certain sort of contribution to what is called the 'personal good' of the relatively badly off. The personal good of an individual reflects, on this conception, not just their well-being, but also the inequality that they suffer relative to others. Inequality suffered by those who are relatively worse off in well-being makes them still worse off in regard to personal good. This personal good of individuals in turn is summed to determine the value of an outcome. So on this conception there is aggregation of a sort, formal aggregation, but not traditional substantive utilitarian aggregation based on the summation of fixed and prior levels of well-being. Hirose himself favors something like this conception.

It may seem that this very abstract sort of aggregation is merely a kind of bookkeeping trick, without any concrete normative significance. But Hirose argues that both maximin principles and leximin principles violate formal aggregation, so that it isn't an empty formality. A maximin principle determines the relative value of two outcomes by appeal to the relative well-being of the worst-off in each. It hence is indifferent to all differences in well-being among those who are not worst-off, and so violates a kind of Pareto constraint. Leximin, the lexicographical extension of maximin, which in case of ties among the well-being of the worst-off moves on to a consideration of the relative well-being of the second-worst-off, and so on, meets the Pareto constraint, but violates another feature of formal aggregation that Hirose calls 'continuity'. This is because it can be indifferent to differences in the well-being of those at relatively higher-levels of well-being.

I would have welcomed a more extensive informal explanation of the continuity condition than Hirose provides, and an explanation of why this argument for the concrete normative significance of formal aggregation would not be undercut if the patterns of distribution favored by maximin or leximin were allowed to determine a book-keeping value assigned to persons in the manner of Broomian inequality. But it is probably in application to cases that the content of formal aggregation can be best explored.

One case that Hirose suggests reveals unacceptable implications of substantive aggregation but not of formal aggregation is T. M. Scanlon's World Cup Case: Jones has been injured during a broadcast of the World Cup, and our choice is to inconvenience millions by cutting off their access to the broadcast, or to leave Jones trapped for an hour under machinery at the cost of some extra agony. The summation of well-being favored by classical utilitarians suggests that the best outcome may involve trading Jones' horrible hour for the summed satisfactions of millions of engaged viewers, and that seems wrong. But the fan of formal aggregation can maintain that there are other factors that play into the proper aggregation in such a case and deliver the intuitively correct result.

Or consider an intrapersonal case: some ethicists evaluate the quality of lives with regard to the sums of well-being that they contain, irrespective of how well-being is temporally distributed within such a life. However, David Velleman has argued that if we compare two lives in which the sum of well-being is the same, but in which respectively the life is improving over time or getting worse, we can see that the first life, the improving life, is better. Hirose agrees. Substantive interpersonal aggregation would take the well-being of an individual at different times and sum it to determine the overall quality of their life, and is implausible in such a case. But Hirose suggests, again following Broome, that we can attribute the good of the improving life to different temporal stages of the life, and yet engage in formal aggregation of that sort of personal good of temporal stages to generate an intuitive assessment of the value of the whole life.

But Hirose's most detailed development of the implications and virtues of formal aggregation comes in the second part of his book, where he discusses at length the proper treatment of several cases arising from Taurek's famous Rescue Case. Begin with that case:

There is a fixed supply of a drug. Six suffer from diseases. Person A needs all of the drug to live. Persons B through F each need one fifth of the drug to live. How should the drug be distributed?

Taurek suggests that a fair coin should be flipped, giving A an even chance of getting all of the drug, and giving the other five an even chance of getting the amounts they would need. But others feel that the drug should be given to B through F, since more will be certainly saved. And some take a middle road, thinking that there should be a weighted lottery, with 1 out of 6 chances that A gets all the drug, and 5 out of 6 chances that B through F each is given a fifth of it.

Hirose believes that the best option is distributing the drug directly to the five. Substantive aggregation in the manner of classical utilitarianism delivers this result, but recall that it also suggests the wrong response to the World Cup Case. So it would be better, it seems, to have a rationale for the distribution of the drug to the five in the Rescue Case that doesn't extend to an implausible implication in the World Cup Case.

Frances Kamm has argued that there is a nonaggregative way to deliver this result. Consider a three person case, where A needs all of the drug to live, but B and C only need half each. It seems worse that B and C die than that B alone die. And yet it seems equally bad for A and B to die. So it seems that the outcome to avoid is that in which the two die. It seems that the extra life saved by distributing the drug to B and C would vindicate that choice over saving A, without requiring any implausible summation of well-being of the traditional utilitarian sort that leads to trouble in the World Cup Case. However, Kamm notes a problem with this nonaggregative treatment. Consider the Sore Throat Case: we have the choice between saving A's life or B's life, and our drugs are such that if we save B's life we can also cure C of a painful sore throat as a side benefit. It seems to both Hirose and Kamm that this would not be a situation in which it would be appropriate to choose to save B rather than A, merely on the grounds of C's sore throat. That is not properly respectful of A. Rather one should flip a coin. But a natural extension of Kamm's nonaggregative argument of the Rescue Case suggests that one should save B and cure the sore throat as a side benefit. Kamm introduces a fix for this difficulty, which is the claim that the sore throat is an irrelevant good in such a case, because it is of striking insignificance when compared to the lives in question, and so should be ignored. She also suggests that in a choice between saving 1000 people and saving 1001 different people, it might be that even the extra life is an irrelevant good, so that a fair coin should determine which group lives and which dies.

Hirose agrees that in the Sore Throat Case the right thing to do is to flip a fair coin. But Hirose also thinks that the sore throat is not totally irrelevant, since in a case where millions of sore throats are at issue that might plausibly be thought to be a decisive factor. And he also claims that it can't be plausibly thought that an extra life is an irrelevant good in the case of the 1000 versus the 1001. So what is to be done? Apply formal aggregation.

In the Rescue Case, the idea is that there is an unfairness done to A when A is not saved or given a chance to be saved, and the drug is given directly to B through F instead, but that the extra well-being gained in giving the drug to B through F is a weightier and more significant ethical factor, and so formal aggregation can allow the correct result. In the original Sore Throat Case, there is also supposed to be an unfairness that would be suffered by A due to the saving of B without a coin flip, but in that case it would not be trumped by the real but small good of eliminating C's sore throat. However, if very many sore throats were involved, a different result could be delivered by formal aggregation. In addition, formal aggregation may even allow that it is proper to flip a fair coin in the 1000 lives versus 1001 lives case, since the additional single life is a relevant good that yet might be outweighed by the unfairnesses that would be suffered by the 1000 if the 1001 were chosen to live without a coin flip.

I've only sketched what I take to be the main arguments of the book. There are also extended discussions of other treatments of the Rescue Case and its ilk, of objections to aggregation due to the separateness of persons, and of the moral significance of weighted lotteries. The book will be of interest to those dealing with any of these topics, and especially to those who wish to further explore Broome-style treatments of unfairness and inequality. It is part of an ambitious three-book development of an aggregative version of telic egalitarianism and its application to health care issues. The other parts are Iwao Hirose, Egalitarianism (Routledge, 2015) and Greg Bognar and Iwao Hirose, The Ethics of Health Care Rationing (Routledge, 2014).