Moral Aims: Essays on the Importance of Getting It Right and Practicing Morality with Others

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Cheshire Calhoun, Moral Aims: Essays on the Importance of Getting It Right and Practicing Morality with Others, Oxford University Press, 2016, 259pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199328796.

Reviewed by Kathryn J. Norlock, Trent University


This collection of previously published essays by Cheshire Calhoun, with an original introduction, supplies an absorbing assemblage of some well-known and some lesser-known essays that hang together remarkably well. The overall effect is that of a robust and provocative approach to ethical theory, in a form that will appeal to readers of nonideal theory and readers of feminist ethical work such as that of Margaret Urban Walker (whom Calhoun cites as an influence). It is a study in meta-philosophy as well as morality, consistently recalling our attention to how ethical theorists justify our methods. The meta-philosophical strengths of the whole move me to recommend it to anyone in moral philosophy; I particularly recommend the book to scholars of nonideal theory who may find it easy to forget that past work in feminist philosophy offers some of the best models of nonidealizing methodology. The hardcover is, happily, not priced unreasonably, so I can further commend it to instructors for use in graduate and upper-level undergraduate seminars in ethics.

Calhoun builds a persuasive case for morality as an enterprise constituted as much by social practices as by abstract theorizing. Calhoun's is not merely the position that moral theory has feasibility constraints when applied. On the contrary, she offers these essays as multiple viewing angles on her position that "Absent a social practice, there is no morality, although there might be moral knowledge" (13). Conventionally, we conceive of morality as a correct action guide, a theory that aims for accuracy in an attempt to "get it right," which we then carry into application in the world. Calhoun argues that our critically reflective aim of theorizing toward accuracy supervenes on -- and often unwittingly presumes -- the backdrop of a social practice of morality (17).

Reflection on the content of the social practice of morality is what normative moral theorizing should be about. The theorist is not to begin by ignoring actual social practices of morality, including those that shape the theorist's own thought, in order to construct an ideal normative standard to then be applied in evaluating actual practices (14).

In short, morality refers to how we engage others as much as it refers to how we develop and shape principles and theories, and moral social practices are not anterior applications of theories; "the social practice of morality really is morality" (26). The rest of the book is a study in the ways that these two conceptions of morality, the theoretical one aiming to get it right and the social one aiming to live with others, work together and sometimes in tension due to the plurality of our moral aims.

The book has nine chapters, divided into four parts. Part I, "Critical Morality and Social Norms," includes the first two chapters. Chapter 1, "Moral Failure," takes up the topic of "moral revolutionaries," that is, "people who succeed in thinking from a moral point of view that both exceeds and improves upon the conventional moral understandings broadly shared in their social worlds" (27). Revolutionaries and resisters bear a special burden in light of the tension between morality as getting principles right and morality as living with others. Calhoun persuasively demonstrates that admirable revolutionaries can "get it right" in a way that "actually produces a particular kind of moral failure of their lives," and the kind of moral failure she has in mind can include moral revolutionaries' nonacceptance by less principled peers, loneliness or abandonment in the course of living up to their convictions, even compromise and loss of integrity if they must find a way to navigate a morally nonideal world knowing that their compromises are wrong (27). Showing this does not show that traditional moral theorizing is wrong, Calhoun says; rather, her account of moral failure indicates that traditional ethical views of morality as "getting it right" fail to capture something that matters about the good or bad life of one who fails, a tantalizing contemporary appreciation of the ancient puzzle as to whether one can be unhappy and virtuous.

The chapter is compelling, although ideally it would be updated to show connection to the next chapter on shame. For example, Calhoun notes the "two ideals for what moral lives should look like, . . . the familiar ideal of getting it right" and "the ideal of participating in a shared scheme of social cooperation" (42). In light of the tragedies and compromises faced by revolutionaries and resisters, and knowing that Chapter 2 is titled "An Apology for Moral Shame," I wondered if perhaps shame accomplishes the second ideal when the familiar ideal is unmet, that is, if shame is a form of participation in the shared scheme that is available to someone who could not maintain adherence to a correct action-guiding principle. I think Calhoun would agree that this is a main point of Chapter 2, that shame serves precisely this function, and it is a downside of a collection of previous publications that those sorts of synthesizing connections are not always offered. Chapter 2, in its turn, is a gripping account of shame, a major contribution to understanding it as "a mark of moral maturity" (49), and immensely helpful to understanding how one can feel moral shame in a sensible way even when one does not morally endorse the ideal one is not meeting.

Part II, "Reaching, Relying On, and Contesting Social Consensus on Moral Norms," includes chapters 3 through 5, the most thematically connected chapters of the book. Chapter 3, "The Virtue of Civility," deals with the potential objection that civility, like etiquette, is a mere conformity to others' expectations. Calhoun offers energetic arguments to the contrary, arguing that a function of civility is to communicate basic moral attitudes. Civility is the social virtue of expressiveness of one's respect for others. I am only partly persuaded by Calhoun's view that civility is further owed to those who do not get morality right; that is, she maintains that civility is not obviously ruled out when one is confronted with others with moral views one deplores. Even here, Calhoun maintains, if one is committed to morality, then one must be committed to its instantiation in a social world, including one's communication of respect and interest in living with others. If each moral agent individually decided whether or not to be civil depending on the moral principles of the other, then we would have to abandon hopes of working out our differences ("civility anarchy" (96)) and living together in a civil society. If this yields a conflict with integrity, Calhoun accepts that cost; "it may be unwise to expect or desire a unity of the virtues" (100). It is the virtue that most heavily draws on Calhoun's commitment to morality as not, first and foremost, getting principles right, and rather as, more basically, "something we do together" (102). I remain concerned that when one who does not get morality right also refuses to get together, and I continue respecting another who has committed to disrespect and withdrawal, then the goal posts of morality may continually move away from what seems right.

Chapter 4, "Common Decency," offers an argument for the minimal gifts of kindness as something between the required and the supererogatory, a form of social moral practice that it is wrong never to offer. This is not merely an argument for an imperfect virtue, which arguably is always elective on particular occasions even if required over time. Calhoun argues that decency is not always simply elective on every particular occasion, and instead comprises the day-to-day moral duties of a minimally well-formed moral agent. The essay is an important contribution to the study of supererogatory action.

Chapter 5, "Standing for Something," attends to integrity, a concept in the background of the preceding chapters that now takes center stage. All three social virtues -- civility, decency, and integrity -- are importantly expressive, forms of accounting for oneself before others. Integrity turns out to be a "master virtue" that presses into service "a host of other virtues" including civility (153), but the chapter's appearance after one on civility rather than before it works surprisingly well, as the culmination of arguments for increasingly fundamental virtues as essentially social and communicative. Integrity, as Calhoun develops it, is "the social virtue of acting on one's own judgment," indeed "one's best judgment" (151, 150). Integrity "calls us simultaneously to stand behind our convictions and to take seriously others' doubts about them," if one is sincerely interested in evaluating one's own judgment as one's best. I hesitate at the inclusion of "best" as an ingredient of the judgment one offers with integrity. I continue to think that integrity can be compatible with great epistemological humility regarding whether one thinks one either knows best or has arrived at one's best judgment, and I suspect a reflective agent's willingness to offer oneself for scrutiny and to be wrong goes a long way toward accounting for commitment to stand by one's convictions without having to be optimal or best.

Part III, "Conventionalized Wrongdoing," includes chapters 6 and 7. Chapter 6, "Kant and Compliance with Conventionalized Injustice," is the only essay that I felt was not entirely in keeping with the themes of this collection. Calhoun describes this essay as "a little exercise in doing non-ideal theory" (vii), but the whole collection strikes me as a large work in nonideal theory more broadly conceived; this portion felt out of step with the whole. Yet I found myself regularly entertaining thoughts of assigning the essay to students of Kant's ethics, so its singular value for polemic arguments against Kant's first formulation of the Categorical Imperative may be worth its less than harmonious presence in the book. Kantians will resist the consequentialist take on the methods of universalization of one's maxim, but in offering it, Calhoun raises just the sorts of questions that one must entertain when doing Kant's ethics, regarding whether Kant relies on conventions of social practice to justify his moral obligations.

Chapter 7, "Responsibility and Reproach," does exciting work in examining responsibility and culpability in nonideal contexts, and returns to the themes of Parts I and II, including the roles of blame, excuse, sanction, and reproach in morally compromised and nonideal moral contexts, or in Calhoun's terms, "abnormal moral contexts" (187). These are to be understood as contrasting with "normal moral contexts" in which "the rightness or wrongness of different courses of action is transparent to individuals, where 'transparent' does not mean self-evident," but means that participants "share a common moral language, agree for the most part on moral rules, and use similar methods of moral reasoning," even if they disagree on applications (194). This brings to mind Calhoun's moral revolutionary from Chapter 1, whom I take to be operating in abnormal moral contexts in which being understandable to others may even mean compromising his or her principles. The opacity of such problematic moral contexts makes it difficult to locate blameworthiness or excusable ignorance for participation in nonideal conditions, but this is no reason to give up on social practices of morality; Calhoun concludes that "in abnormal moral contexts, it may be reasonable to reproach moral failings even when individuals are not blameworthy" (208). This chapter has important implications for much political and moral theorizing today, and its import is enhanced by the chapters that precede it.

Part IV, "Telling Moral Stories for Others," develops a different aspect of shared moral life, that of offering our interpretive stories of others' actions in order to make sense of them. Chapter 8, "Emotional Work," is fascinating as an account of our moral experience with the management of the emotions of others. The final chapter, "Changing One's Heart," is Calhoun's well-known essay on aspirational forgiveness. Calhoun notes that she placed it last in the book "because it appears more distant philosophically from the other essays" (212), but it seems more strongly connected to the other chapters than did Chapter 6, and it is an effective thematic conclusion to the sorts of nonideal activities that moral agents must pursue in the imperfect world described throughout the book. Like the integrity-compromising importance of civility, like the elective and yet morally needed sorts of gifts involved in decency, and like the risks involved in the first chapter's moral failure of the revolutionary, forgiveness demands another form of accounting, to oneself and others, in shared moral terms, for what it is that flawed and erring agents do. Her account of aspirational forgiveness for unrepentant wrongdoers was influential in my formation of my own views, although I continue to disagree with some of its aspects. I embrace Calhoun's account of forgiveness as a form of appreciating the biography of the person who commits a wrong, which does not excuse the wrong, but enjoins "that one stop demanding that the person be different from what she is," or that the wrong be different from what it was (245). Aspirational forgiveness "is the choice not to demand that she improve. It is the choice to place respecting another's way of making sense of her life before resentfully enforcing moral standards" (245).

I think that Calhoun errs in arguing that forgiving a deserving penitent cannot be elective, because "Once the decision in favor of desert has been made, forgiveness becomes required" (225). This position seems overcommitted to a view that desert is the only reason to treat another a certain way. It is out of keeping with the preceding chapters in which we are described as having multiple aims and the demands of abstract theories like desert are described as in tension with social moral practices. The Calhoun of the preceding eight chapters does not seem like an author who finds us optionless in the face of desert, and perhaps this is the reason that in her introduction to Part IV, she described this essay as most philosophically distant (that is, perhaps she meant it was most distant from her present views).

Calhoun expresses the aspiration in the introduction that the arrangement of the essays non-chronologically is "designed to disrupt efforts to read these essays as independent topics," and instead to see them as developing her picture of moral philosophy as "reflection on the content of the social practice of morality" (14). Her arrangement succeeds at this, and I am persuaded by her view of morality. I would have been even happier with a chronological ordering of chapters. The arrangement by thematic content is gratifying, but I would prefer to see the evolution of the work of the author over time, and some updating in the form of an epilogue as to whether Calhoun has revised her views in ways that (I think I find) are reflected in the later pieces. Still, this is a volume that should be considered in its entirety as a challenge to traditional moral theory. I am the better for having read it.