Moral Animals: Ideals and Constraints in Moral Theory

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Catherine Wilson, Moral Animals: Ideals and Constraints in Moral Theory, Oxford University Press, 2004, 332pp, $74.00, ISBN 0199267677.

Reviewed by Edward Johnson, University of New Orleans


In the first half of her new book, which can only be called "feminist" despite that word's current unfashionability, Catherine Wilson presents a meta-theory which views morality as a system of "advantage-reducing imperatives," whose "confirmation" is tied to convincing a suitable audience that agents in the best "paraworld" would act in the described manner. In the second half, she examines familiar ideas about social distribution and subordination -- especially as these pertain to women -- and argues for egalitarianism.

In her meta-theory, Wilson rejects emotivism (50), but embraces a kind of non-cognitivism. She sees moral judgments as based on preferences, or "elections," concerning the actions of ideal agents. "When we make a moral judgement, we represent certain patterns of action and forbearance as instantiated in a morally good world, without coming to know that they are." (61) Moral rules are thus regarded as the "laws of nature" of alternative worlds (48). "To give a prescriptive theory for actual human beings is to give a descriptive theory for ideal agents," she says (47), and goes so far as to suggest that "confirmed statements can even be regarded (though I will avoid this locution) as 'true'" (43). How we tell that one world is better than another remains sketchy, however. "A moral judgment can be said to be confirmed when it commands agreement by appropriately informed morally intentioned persons" (43). There are elements of ideal-observer theory here, but Wilson believes we "cannot require competent judges of moral theories to have the extraordinary qualifications of ideal observers" (69).

Wilson's meta-theoretical treatment segues into discussion of the limits on theory (Chs. 3 and 4), the claims of anonymity and partiality (Ch. 5), and equality and merit in distributive justice (Chs. 6 and 7), and these chapters touch on an interesting variety of issues. She claims, for example, that justice requires statistical equality of outcomes. Agreeing with Rawls's critique of the natural lottery -- "If it is right to compensate for undeserved misfortune, it may also be right to subtract from undeserved reward" -- she rejects "the argument that what is not necessarily wrong for an individual cannot be wrong for a group" (251). She believes that a collection of "microethically unobjectionable choices and transactions" (277) may nonetheless result in an unfair pattern of advantage and disadvantage (253).

That pattern is discerned, Wilson thinks, in the absence of statistical equality of outcomes. "It is not morally intolerable that African-American basketball players are more respected and rewarded than Japanese basketball players. In a just world, however, statistical inequalities ought to balance out from group to group." Does this mean that no identifiable group ought to be at an overall disadvantage? Does it mean that every group must have its specially recognized merit? It may be true that "considering merit as an objective property, statistical inequalities of outcome among different groups can only arise through [unjust] discrimination" (250). But some (former Harvard President Lawrence Summers, perhaps) will think that unresolved empirical disagreements leave the question debatable. It may be true that "considering merit as special expertise contingently possessed by some groups of humans, inequality of outcomes does not imply [unjust] discrimination, but it does imply an arbitrary conception of human excellence that ought to confer no particular entitlements" (250). But some will disagree that the possibility of entitlement-bearing human excellences has been disposed of. Or, as Wilson recognizes, they may think that people's value is not related to either their merits or their needs (212).

Though Wilson discusses equality and subordination expressly in the last chapter (Ch. 8), the topic pervades the book. For example, early on (57-58) she cites Alasdair MacIntyre's description of a practice, which mentions "standards of excellence, which are appropriate to and partially definitive of that form of activity," along with his examples: football, chess, farming, architecture, physics, chemistry, biology, painting, and the making and sustaining of family life. She comments:

Now, few women have historically been involved in football, chess, architecture, physics, chemistry, and biology at a level involving the pursuit of excellence according to externally established standards, even if their current involvement is much greater than it was. Indeed, except for weaving and sewing it is difficult to think of an activity traditionally associated with women and traditionally performed by them in sizeable numbers that has ever been tested by and made subject to objective standards of excellence. MacIntyre cites the making and sustaining of family life as a practice, but women rarely take cleaning, cooking, and home nursing and education to specialist levels of excellence. (58)

Some readers will view this as nitpicking -- especially since, by Wilson's reckoning, MacIntyre could have given no relevant examples of women's practices except weaving and sewing. Other readers will view her as making a telling point about women's invisibility in modern moral philosophy. Philosophers such as Aristotle, Rousseau, and Kant, Wilson suggests later, "were right to appreciate that men and women stood in a curious relationship to one another where the distribution of the components of well-being was concerned" (254). Modern moral philosophy should renew its interest in this relationship, she thinks, of course without repeating "their descriptive errors or their unacceptable prescriptions" (255).

Women as a group are deprived, as compared with men, by many objective measures, and can, Wilson argues, be described as "existing in a condition of subordination" (258). Women, she says, "experience deficits with respect to each of the known and necessary components of well-being -- consumption, expression, affiliation, activity, participation, and respectful depiction" (260). Various excuses for this situation are scouted and rejected. She allows that the situation may result from "millions of interactions between individual parties, each of which may be in order from the microethical perspective" (262), but insists that that does not make it unproblematic or acceptable.

Examining evolutionary psychology seriously, because it purports to focus on real differences between the sexes (268), Wilson rejects its explanations for female subordination, which invoke gender-based differences in aggressiveness and competitiveness, vulnerability and altruism, and the encumbrances of maternity. She argues that even if some evolutionary psychological account of underlying dispositions is correct, these "do not predict and do not justify the current state of the world," as this contains excess subordination due to contingent historical circumstances (274).

Among the few remaining modern hunters and gatherers and nomadic herders whose lives are considered to resemble most closely those of our distant ancestors, female subordination is minimal, for the confinement and management of women is incompatible with survival. The emergence of permanent settlements and agriculture in the Neolithic altered the balance … . If metal were not malleable at temperatures achievable with charcoal fires; if no wild animals had proved themselves amenable to domestication; if grain could not be stored for more than a week; and if no piles of stones over five feet high could stand, women would not be subordinated. (274-276)

Some philosophers have argued that, although the condition of women is unjust, to remedy it would be too costly: important other goods would be lost, or put at risk, in the process. But Wilson has already argued in an earlier chapter for counterweights to the argument from heavy costs which apply here (154). "Male advantage reflects the enjoyment of ill-gotten gains; implies the violation of an implicit contract to cooperate for mutual benefit; and is the product of increasingly culpable ignorance" (282-283).

Wilson argues that in various ways the sexual status quo requires change. "Men stand under a moral obligation to divert some proportion of their energies from productive and directive activities to maintenance [e.g., housekeeping] and uncompensated amateur activities" (289). But that does not mean that women should simply assume the lifestyle of men (290, cf. 281). Childrearing also requires adjustment, the exact nature of which remains unclear (290-291). Wilson concludes her last chapter with a discussion of the morality of love, including a brief critique of prostitution and pornography (299) and a defense of "mild repression" in connection with social practices of marriage and divorce (300).

Despite her technical language of "paraworlds," and despite a good deal of miscellaneous reference to the literature of ethology and social science, Wilson's main argumentative technique is the familiar one -- appeal to the reader's intuitions. For example: "It is simply the case that I judge a world in which gender equality has been produced by an [unjust] execution to be worse, all things considered, than our existing unfair world and I expect competent judges to support me in this claim" (278). Philosophers can be depended on to disagree with some of those appeals.

Wilson anticipates some challenges, and the book often engages in a sympathetic interpretation of her opponents' arguments. In the case of other challenges -- for example, the question of how the importance of remediation of gender-based injustice is to be weighed against that of other unjust discrimination, such as that based on race or class -- much remains to be explored. But Wilson's book engages, in an energetic and constructive way, with many of the main theorists of moral philosophy, including discussions not only of Aristotle, Hume, Hobbes, Kant, and Rousseau, but of such recent theorists as David Gauthier, Thomas Nagel, Robert Nozick, John Rawls, Thomas Scanlon, Samuel Scheffler, Michael Walzer, and Bernard Williams, along with briefer mention of many others. It is a thoughtful and well-written book.

She ends with an image -- chimpanzees adorning themselves with weights -- derived from primatologist Wolfgang Koehler, who explained their behavior with the observation that "when anything moves with our bodies we feel richer and more stately." Wilson adds that "the enhancement effect of the burdens and encumbrances of the morality system and its often heavily born[e] responsibilities is not to be underestimated" (301). It is a fine emblem for the complex natural-cum-social texture woven by the moral animals we are.