Moral Dilemmas in Medieval Thought: From Gratian to Aquinas

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M. V. Dougherty, Moral Dilemmas in Medieval Thought: From Gratian to Aquinas, Cambridge University Press, 2011, 226pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107007079.

Reviewed by William E. Mann, University of Vermont


When you sense that a conversation is flagging, try saying "I think there are lots of cases in real life where, no matter what people choose, they can't avoid doing something morally wrong." Given the right audience, conversation should become animated, perhaps even agitated. Dougherty's book lets us examine a written conversation about moral dilemmas, a conversation extending from Gratian (twelfth century; precise dates unknown) to Johannes Capreolus (1380-1444), stopping along the way to hear the opinions of William of Auxerre, Alexander of Hales, Raymond Lull, and Thomas Aquinas. The scope suggested by the book's subtitle is thus a bit modest but defensibly so: Dougherty appeals to Capreolus to answer a question taken to be unanswered by Aquinas. And Dougherty is willing to take on contemporary discussions of moral dilemmas. (Full disclosure: I am one whose views are taken to task.)

Dougherty defines a moral dilemma as "any situation in which an agent cannot fulfill all genuine impending moral obligations" (3). An agent's state, when facing a dilemma, is a state of being perplexed. Here are some putative cases of perplexity that Dougherty discusses.

Persecutors of Christ (37-39) Those who were responsible for killing Christ believed in all good conscience that they were putting a blasphemous heretic to death. They would have sinned against their religion by not following what conscience dictated. But they sinned by killing the Son of God (who, one might add, petitioned on their behalf, "Father, forgive them, for they know not what they do").

Hidden Fugitive (38-39; 78-79) Alpha is hiding Beta. Gamma, one of Beta's enemies, asks Alpha about Beta's whereabouts. If Alpha tells the truth, Alpha sins by betraying Beta. If Alpha lies, Alpha also sins.

Poisoned Chalice (129-130) A priest is obligated to consume the wine remaining in the chalice at a mass. Suppose it has been poisoned. If he does not drink the wine, he sins. If he does drink it, he sins either by committing suicide or by tempting God to intervene miraculously on his behalf.

Jephthah's Vow (137-139) Jephthah vows to God that if God allows him to defeat his enemies, he will sacrifice the first creature he sees upon returning home. The first creature he sees is his daughter.

Hatred of God (163-167) William of Ockham's thought experiment: suppose God were to command us to hate him. Natural law tells us to love God, but natural law also tells us that "The commandments of God are to be obeyed" (148ff).

Before we wade into a discussion of the cases, we should ask what is at stake here. Dougherty seems willing to describe his project as an investigation into "the history of moral dilemma theory" (2, 203, and several occasions in between). This expression puts too much emphasis in the wrong place. Theory lies elsewhere. Dilemmas provide evidence against which normative theories are to be tested. Two desirable features of a normative theory are completeness and consistency. A normative theory is complete if, for any situation in which an agent is placed, the theory prescribes a course of action that the agent ought to take. A theory is consistent if it never prescribes two or more courses of action for the same situation that are such that they cannot all be followed. If there are incommensurable values, they pose a difficulty for completeness.

Dilemmas threaten a theory's consistency. Mill and Kant propose rival theories claimed to be complete and consistent. Each theory rests on one ultimate principle, the principle of utility for Mill, the categorical imperative for Kant. The attractiveness of having just one fundamental principle is like the attractiveness of monotheism -- no squabbling plurality of gods, no competing principles. If one strives for consistency yet recognizes a plurality of principles, then it is advisable to marshal the principles into some hierarchical order, so that whatever the choice situation, some principle or other takes precedence in that situation. (In the strong-arm world of the Olympian deities, Zeus and his siblings divide the territory, but Zeus wields the lightning bolt.)

The moral theory under consideration in this volume is natural law theory. Dougherty regards natural law theory, or at least Aquinas's version of it, as containing an indefinite number of fundamental normative principles. Each principle is "self-evident" to synderesis (conscience). Thus cognitive lucidity seems to provide no way of lexically ordering them. The Summa theologiae famously champions the principle that "good is to be done and pursued, and evil is to be avoided." There is another principle, however, to which, according to Dougherty, "Aquinas gives the most analysis throughout his writings," namely, the principle that "the commandments of God are to be obeyed" (147-148). How are these two principles related? Are they equally foundational, or is one subordinated to the other?

Passages from Aquinas cited by Dougherty are puzzling on this score. In his Sentences commentary Aquinas says that "It is requisite that practical reason be led by some self-evident principles, such as 'evil is not to be done,' 'the precepts of God are to be obeyed,' and others" (149). This passage strongly suggests that the two principles enjoy equal status. Passages from Aquinas's commentaries on the epistles to the Galatians and to the Romans tell in favor of a different relationship: "The act of conscience that something must be done is nothing other than a judgment that it would be against God's will not to do it" (on Galatians; 154). This passage appears to confer a special status on the divine command principle, regarding it, perhaps, as a metaethical principle that explains what makes some things obligatory and others forbidden. If the two principles are coequal regulative principles forming part of natural law's content, then natural law theorists should want to explain how they apply to the case of Abraham and Isaac. If, on the other hand, the divine command principle is regarded as a constitutive principle, grounding morality itself and offering agents all the reason they need to act, then it is unclear where natural law theory stands.

Whatever the status of the divine command principle, it is clear that natural law theory, as envisioned by Aquinas, is multi-principled. It is thus susceptible to the charge that it is inconsistent, in the sense specified above. So let us see how it might handle the cases of putative dilemmas, using Dougherty as our guide.

The glossators on Gratian's Decretum deploy an important distinction in dealing with the Persecutors of Christ case. There is a difference between being genuinely perplexed and feeling perplexed on account of ignorance. Christ's persecutors were ignorant of his true nature: had they known it they would have seen that there was a permissible course of action open to them, namely, not to put Jesus to death. Their conscience may have been sincere but was nonetheless badly formed; in fact, culpably formed. Dougherty reports that according to the gloss in question, the persecutors were negligent "in not consulting the Apostles and the sacred scriptures" (39).

Three general themes can be found in the glossators' remarks. One is that there are no genuine moral dilemmas. An omniscient being could see that for every agent in any choice situation, there is at least one right act available to the agent. Another theme is that all cases of subjectively felt perplexity are owing to ignorance (it is easy to extend this to include mistaken belief) for which the perplexed agents are culpable. Ignorance of the law is commonly said to be no excuse, but the glossators appear poised to adopt a sterner stance -- no kind of ignorance excuses. A third theme follows from the denial of genuine moral dilemmas. There is never a need to rely on the principle, "Choose the lesser of two evils," because one option available to an agent will always be good. The lesser evil principle, moreover, is a kind of devil's gambit, encouraging the thought that sometimes it is permissible to choose evil. (Dougherty has an interesting discussion of variations on the lesser evil principle on pp. 190-195.)

A common contemporary secular attitude about the Hidden Fugitive case maintains that there is no dilemma here because there would be nothing wrong with Alpha's lying to Gamma (when Gamma is a Nazi and Beta is Anne Frank; the attitude flips, one presumes, when Gamma is a Navy Seal and Beta is Osama bin Laden). The glossators and Alexander of Hales believe that lying is always wrong, yet agree that there is no dilemma. Alpha has a third, permissible alternative to betraying or lying: Alpha can refuse to say anything. Whatever evil that might ensue would be Gamma's doing, not Alpha's. It is not hard to see in this resolution a reliance on the thesis that there is a significant moral distinction between doing something and allowing something to happen.

Aquinas's resolution of the Poisoned Chalice case can be made to illustrate two important features of his thought. (1) Aquinas distinguishes between simpliciter dilemmas and dilemmas secundum quid. A simpliciter dilemma is one that arises through no prior fault of the agent. A secundum quid dilemma arises because of some prior fault of the agent. (2) For Aquinas this distinction is similar in one respect to the distinction between reptilian mammals and criminal mammals: the former do not exist but the latter can and do. Dougherty observes that in this case the priest had not done something wrong antecedently that lands him in his predicament. Thus the case is not a secundum quid dilemma. But Aquinas does not want to allow the predicament to be a simpliciter dilemma, lest natural law and liturgical practice be in conflict. Aquinas's resolution is that there is no dilemma at all in this case. Dougherty points out on Aquinas's behalf that one horn of the dilemma, "if the priest does not consume the wine, then he sins," omits a critical circumstance. Make the circumstance explicit and the amplified horn, "if he does not consume the poisoned wine, he sins," is revealed to be false.

To take stock: Aquinas believes that there are moral dilemmas, but that every one of them is secundum quid. An omniscient being could see that every dilemmatic situation an agent confronts was preceded by and is attributable to some morally culpable condition the agent possessed or some morally wrong action the agent performed. In an earlier paper I had been skeptical about ascribing the secundum quid thesis to Aquinas. However, Dougherty marshals powerful evidence for the ascription (138-139). (I am not certain that Aquinas holds the converse. There might be cases in which an agent's sin results in no dilemma. That would be a version, I suppose, of moral luck.) Invoking our omniscient being one last time, we can ask the question whether such a being could see that for every dilemmatic situation there is a permissible way out available to the agent, or whether some dilemmas have no happy resolution. Dougherty finds no answer to that question in Aquinas. He reports, however, that by the time of Capreolus, a tradition had developed that maintained, on Aquinas's behalf, that all dilemmas are resolvable by the agent, without ever requiring the agent to commit the lesser of two evils. (183-188).

The attractiveness of the secundum quid thesis is that it offers assurance that multi-principled natural law theory is consistent. At the same time a proponent of the thesis must be prepared to show how it applies to all putatively dilemmatic cases. Jephthah's Vow is a challenge for Aquinas's thesis, one that neither Aquinas nor Dougherty fully meet. Put simply, the challenge is this. In adjacent articles of Question 88 of Summa theologiae II-II, Aquinas implies that Jephthah should not keep his vow (article 2) and says that every vow must be kept (article 3). Of course it is possible to put an interpretation on the texts that makes them conform to the secundum quid thesis. It is equally possible to interpret them so that they do not.

I found the discussion of Ockham's Hatred of God case to be less helpful than it might have been. The case is more of a paradox than a dilemma. Suppose that right reason tells Alpha that Alpha should obey God's commands. Suppose further that God commands Alpha to hate God. So far we have no dilemma. Suppose even further, then, that we expand a bit on what right reason delivers to Alpha, namely, that Alpha should obey God's commands out of love for God (and not, say, out of fear). Alpha then should hate God out of love for God. Does it follow, as Francisco Suárez seems to think, that if Alpha "were to obey the command to hate God, [Alpha] would need to love and hate God at the same time" (165)? If simultaneity were required, Alpha would not become the first person to exhibit a synchronic love-hate relationship toward another. But simultaneity need not even be required. If God commands Beta to learn to speak Korean, God would not expect instant success. "If you really love me, then you must learn to stop loving me" might be the beginning of an episode of psychological ambivalence, but it is not the stuff of which inconsistencies are made. Inconsistency would result if Alpha were simultaneously required to love God and not to love God. Here we should inquire about what exactly is conveyed by God's commandment to cease loving him. Is it that in issuing the command, God would be rescinding the commandment to love him or merely exempting Alpha in particular from obedience to it? In either case no dilemma ensues. Could or would an all-loving God ever issue such a command? One's answer to that question, I suspect, may be bound up with the issue whether the principle, "The commandments of God are to be obeyed," is regulative or constitutive.