Moral Disagreement

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Folke Tersman, Moral Disagreement, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 160pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521853389.

Reviewed by Andrew Fisher, University of Nottingham


According to Tersman, there are two related and common mistakes in the metaethical literature. One is made by antirealists who assume that the argument from disagreement is a simple and successful defence of their position. The other, from the realists, assumes that the argument can easily be defeated in a few quick moves.

Tersman in his interesting and engaging book attempts to expose these mistakes and give the collection of arguments under the label 'the argument from disagreement' the philosophical analysis they deserve. As such this is a much needed and valuable book.

According to Tersman, there are several arguments from disagreement. He focuses on three.

The first argues that the best explanation of the existing moral diversity is that there are no objective moral truths. One may point out that disagreement isn't normally taken as a guide to the objectivity of truth, e.g. within science. Fine, the argument would continue, but in such cases we can show that the 'apparent' disagreement is due to various cognitive shortcomings -- i.e. lack of evidence, a bias, etc. Moreover, when considering moral disagreement, this route is not necessarily available to us. There are in fact faultless moral disagreements. As such, we can move from the fact that there is genuine moral disagreement to the claim that there are no objective moral truths.

Tersman is unimpressed by this argument and in chapters 2 and 3 proposes responses to them. He considers whether the argument fails because it has an inadequate account of cognitive shortcoming and whether the discussion has any bearing on the realist/anti-realist debate at all. In the light of this, he concludes that this first version of the argument from disagreement is unsuccessful:

All of the proposals that have been considered leave the realist with plenty of room to respond, and none of them strengthens antirealism to any significant extent. (61)

In chapter 4 Tersman considers the second variant of the argument from disagreement - the 'argument from inaccessibility'.[1] This differs from the first as it does not start from the supposed empirical fact that there is genuine moral disagreement. It couches the debate in terms of the possibility of genuine disagreement. If realism is true and we can't, a priori, rule out genuine disagreement then moral truths must be inaccessible. For if there had been objectively true answers to moral questions, then we would have reason to expect convergence on them, at least in the long run and among competent inquirers. This is because agents with no cognitive defects will eventually track down the moral truth, and if two agents have no cognitive shortcomings then they will converge over the same moral truths; however, if the realist can only offer us inaccessible moral truths, then so much the worse for realism. Tersman thinks that this argument -- like the last -- fails (81).

It seems that the space for a coherent and challenging 'argument from disagreement' is disappearing fast. However, in chapters 5 and 6 Tersman develops his positive account. In 5 he deals with what he calls the 'argument from ambiguity'. This argument is, he tells us, the 'key' (xv) because if the realist can respond to this, then the other 'arguments from disagreement' would be no problem. However, Tersman argues that there is no believable response to the argument from ambiguity and, as such, realism should be rejected.

In Chapter 6, Tersman elaborates a recurring issue in his book concerning translation as a positive reason for rejecting moral realism. Essentially, and in basic terms, certain views of translation:

support the claim that we can correctly translate someone's words with our "right", "good," and so on, in spite of the fact that we assign different truth conditions to sentences that predicate them. For that claim is incompatible with realism. (107)


For the rest of this review I consider the 'argument from ambiguity'.

First, it is worth making a terminological point. Tersman has a clear account of what being a realist amounts to. First, cognitivism: that moral judgments consist solely of suitably qualified -- in functional terms -- beliefs (12). Second, antinihilism: there are facts in virtue of which moral judgements are true (17). Third, absolutism: that any version according to which people ascribe different properties to an action by judging it right, wrong, and so on is incompatible with realism (18). Fourth, objectivism: that moral judgments are true and representational in the same way as physical claims (19).

So, why does the argument from ambiguity -- the 'key argument' -- threaten moral realism?

Tersman claims that, 'Hare was possibly the first to launch the argument from ambiguity.' (85) My rough interpretation of this version of the argument from ambiguity is as follows:

(1) A missionary finds that some cannibals, although using 'good' just as he does, as 'the most general adjective of commendation', also finds that they apply it differently -- e.g. to those who collect the most skulls, those who are the most aggressive, etc.

(2) If the missionary and the cannibals have different applications then they must express different beliefs when applying 'good'.

(3) If they express different beliefs then the missionary and cannibals must be referring to different properties.

(4) If the missionary and cannibals are referring to different properties then they must mean different things by 'good'.

(5) If they mean different things by 'good' then there can be no genuine disagreement between them about what is/isn't good.

Moreover - and this is the key:

(6) We do believe that the missionary and cannibals can have a genuine disagreement about what is 'good'. When the missionary claims that eating human flesh isn't good and the cannibals say it is, they do feel opposed to one another, they engage in a debate to try to convince each other, etc.

Therefore, we seem forced to reject at least one of (3), (4) or (5). So either:

(7) Although the missionary and cannibals apply 'good' differently, they express the same belief and refer to the same property, and 'good' has the same meaning for them.


(8) Although the missionary and cannibals refer to different properties with the term 'good' (because they express different beliefs), they mean the same by 'good'.


(9) Although the missionary and cannibals have different beliefs, they refer to the same property and thus mean the same by 'good'.

Essentially, Tersman argues (a) that (7)-(9) aren't available to the realist, and that as such the realist has to construe the disagreement as merely apparent, but (b) given (6) it is implausible to construe the disagreement as merely apparent. This is the argument from ambiguity.

Let's consider (a) and (b) in turn. The typical response from the modern realist on behalf of (a) is to accept (9) and this is how I will restrict my discussion.[2] They reject the assumption that reference is determined by 'what is in the head' (of course, with certain internalist qualifications). If reference is fixed by, say, actual causal regulation, then the fact that people have different beliefs doesn't challenge the fact that they are referring to the same property. Realism is saved, since it can show why disagreement that appears to be genuine really is genuine. It can show that the missionary and the cannibal aren't talking 'at cross purposes' when debating whether, say, headhunting is 'good', and they can as such respect (6).

Tersman rejects this causal story as a way of accepting (9). His basic reasoning is as follows. How does one decide when one is having a genuine moral disagreement with someone? Do we consider which property it is that regulates our opponent's evaluative terms? No:

In "deciding" whether to regard this person as a genuine opponent … we simply don't care about which property it is that regulates his use of [the term in question] (94).

So the causal story seems to miss the mark. Is (9), then, an untenable option? Not yet. Tersman considers two other options. The realist could adopt Burge's 'social externalism', or Wedgwood's 'conceptual role semantics'.[3] However, he suggests that both of these will fail. I won't go into the details of Tersman's argument here. However, his account of Wedgwood's conceptual role semantics leads me into a number of worries I had with the book.

First, I was slightly perturbed by the fact that the cognitive and ontological issues were sometimes run together: the target of an argument is sometimes said to be realism, but the argument is couched in terms of cognitivism/non-cognitivism (the whole discussion of the 'argument from ambiguity' is an example). This isn't a huge problem; however, I think the reader needs to be particularly attentive to the shift in emphasis, and it would have been beneficial to have more 'signposting' to this fact.

Second, I think that there is a bigger potential problem in how Tersman defines 'realism'. For him, for instance, John McDowell, Richard Miller and Ralph Wedgwood turn out to be non-cognitivists and anti-realists. This may cause us concern. To highlight this worry, consider a quotation from where Tersman discusses Wedgwood's conceptual role semantics:

the main problem in the present context is that realism is conceived as a continuity thesis. It says that moral judgements are beliefs not different in kind from beliefs of areas such as, say, physics, where this partly means that their contents are determined in the same way. Wedgwood's account, by contrast, entails that their contents are determined differently. The meanings of terms in physics are given by rules of theoretical reasoning, whereas the meanings of moral terms are given by rules of practical reasoning. This is to surrender the game to the antirealist. (98)


I think the realist should be less of a coward in the face of this battle. Is it really that crazy that the 'content of beliefs' about electrons is 'determined' in a different way than the content of beliefs about goodness? It seems sensible to me that the realist would read this above quotation as a good reason to give up the continuity thesis. Why, after all, would we think that moral judgements express the same types of belief as those in, say, physics? Arguably, then, we could ask about what starting point this discussion has. In other words, we could suggest that what, for example, Wedgwood's account does is give us a more fine-grained and subtle way of specifying the realist position -- it forces us to give up a crude form of the continuity thesis. This discussion matters because it means that there could be a jolly good reason for accepting (9) e.g. via conceptual role semantics, say, and as such rejecting the argument from ambiguity -- and thereby the 'key argument' in Tersman's book.

However, let's put this point to one side. Let's grant that the realist has to accept that some apparently genuine disagreements -- such as between the missionary and the cannibals -- are just that, merely apparent. Of course, the pressing question now is, 'so what?' 'Why would the truth of that claim pose a threat to realism'? (99). 'Can't the realist just "dig in his heels" and suggest that we are often confused about things?' Tersman suggests not -- things just aren't that easy for the realist. This discussion forms the second part of his 'argument from ambiguity'.

One way of framing the alleged problem for the realist might be this. If there were disagreements with all the features of genuine ones, but which aren't genuine, then how come they have all the features of genuine disagreements?

But Tersman argues that this way of proceeding isn't the best, since it makes it far too easy for realists to respond. First they could argue that we typically enter a disagreement with the presumption that our opponent refers to the same property. We believe that the opponent means the same by their terms as we do. So the reason that there is a feeling of genuine disagreement is just that the parties falsely believe that there is a conflict of beliefs.

Or second, the realist could claim that the reason there is a feeling of a genuine disagreement is because there is a clash of attitudes­ -- not a clash of beliefs. After all:

Realism implies that moral judgement consists of beliefs. But this does not exclude that ethical sentences are often used to express desires as well, and that clashes of desires in some cases underlie disputes over such sentences (101).

Tersman's point, though, is that the challenge that these responses address isn't the most powerful way of putting the challenge to the realist. The question isn't merely how the realist can explain the disagreement. For given the comments above, they could probably do this relatively easily. The point is that in proceeding like this, they are appealing to something external to realism. And this is important, for it was meant to be moral disagreement per se that gave the realist their advantage in the anti-realist/realist debate.

But given the ambiguity claim, this form of reasoning isn't available. Given that there could be cases where people believe they are in a genuine disagreement -- they are disposed to engage each other in discussion, they "feel opposed," they develop arguments and so on -- but where they don't actually disagree, then conceiving of moral disagreements as conflicts of belief doesn't provide the best explanation of why people who are in moral disagreement behave as if moral disagreements are conflicts of belief. An explanation requires something else, something external to realism.

Or to put it another way, the cognitivist infers from moral disagreement to the claim that people in disagreement have incompatible beliefs, but this inference is only plausible if the realist can show that disputes that have the features of a genuine disagreement don't satisfy the ambiguity condition. Unfortunately they can't:

by committing themselves to an idea about the nature of moral disagreement that is neither prompted by nor justifiable in terms of the idea that moral judgements consist of beliefs, this would leave them with little reason for remaining cognitivists. (106)

This conclusion in conjunction with another argument in chapter 4 is meant to provide a tough challenge for the realist.

There are a number of things that I think are worth asking oneself when considering this argument. For instance, 'What counts as a good or bad explanation?' 'When is an inference a bad inference?' 'Why are cognitivists, cognitivists in the first place? -- are they motivated by arguments to the best explanation?' Or perhaps most important, 'Has Tersman characterised cognitivism in a way that the cognitivists are going to be happy with?'

I can't follow up on any of these here. Needless to say, there are many more interesting and controversial things in the argument from ambiguity and in the book in general -- in particular I haven't even touched on the issues about the role of translation that Tersman focuses on in chapter 6. However, overall I found Tersman's book very interesting and thought provoking. And although I felt it required slightly more detail in parts (especially the argument from ambiguity), it is clearly presented and does a good job of clarifying the issues surrounding 'the argument from disagreement'. And I believe that anyone interested in metaethics should read it.

[1] Tersman's discussion is informed by Crispin Wright's Truth and Objectivity. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1992.

[2] See, for instance, Boyd. R. "How To Be a Moral Realist," in G. Sayre-McCord (ed.), Essays on Moral Realism. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 1998, 181-228 and Brink, D. O. Moral Realism and the Foundations of Ethics. New York: Cambridge University Press, 1989.

[3] For example, see T. Burge "Individualism and the Mental", in P. French, T. Uehling, and H. Wettstein (eds.) Midwest Studies in Philosophy 4, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1979. R. Wedgwood "Conceptual Role Semantics for Moral Terms," Philosophical Review 110 (2001), 1-30.