Moral Emotions and Intuitions

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Sabine Roeser, Moral Emotions and Intuitions, Palgrave Macmillan, 2011, 207pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780230232679.

Reviewed by Elizabeth Tropman, Colorado State University


In Moral Emotions and Intuitions, Sabine Roeser defends ethical intuitionism, the view that we can know some objective moral truths non-inferentially. By the book's end, Roeser proposes a new form of intuitionism, affectual intuitionism, which is supposed to succeed where prior conceptions of the intuitionistic idea have failed. Affectual intuitionism is, in Roeser's words, "a combination of ethical intuitionism and a cognitive theory of emotions which understands emotions as cognitive and affective at the same time. According to affectual intuitionism, paradigmatically, moral intuitions are emotions" (xii). On this view, the target non-inferential moral beliefs of intuitionism are complex emotional cognitive states.

Moral Emotions and Intuitions covers a lot of ground. Along the way, Roeser not only makes the case for her affectual formulation of intuitionism over other intuitionistic theories, she also (among other things) argues for moral realism, non-reductive moral non-naturalism, reliabilism about justification, ethical pluralism, ethical particularism, internalism about moral motivation, and a specific cognitive theory of emotion. This is an ambitious project, and Roeser's treatment of the above positions is not always satisfying; the issues at hand often demand more care than Roeser's discussion allows. She is also not as fair to her various opponents -- e.g., non-intuitionists, non-cognitivists, ethical naturalists, consequentialists, non-affectual intuitionists -- as she could be, failing to present the strongest and most sophisticated versions of their views. Still, in Roeser's defense, perhaps one could argue that no one could address all of these topics adequately in such a relatively short book.

Roeser begins, in chapter one, by spelling out what she takes to be the core elements of any intuitionistic theory: moral cognitivism, non-reductive moral realism, and foundationalism about moral knowledge. Intuitionists hold that we can know some objective moral truths involving non-reductive moral properties without inferring them from premises. She then defends the three components of intuitionism against their alternatives. Roeser draws on the views of classic intuitionists, notably Thomas Reid, to clarify the intuitionistic position. She often quotes such intuitionists, as well as other commentators, at length throughout her discussion. Nearly every page of the book contains a block quotation. While Roeser reports that she has included significant textual evidence so as to "let the intuitionists, as it were, speak for themselves, by quoting their original texts, analyzing these quotes, and putting them in the broader context of moral epistemology and ontology" (43), her reliance on quotation is not altogether helpful and can disrupt the book's argumentative thread.

In the second chapter, "Different Forms of Intuitionism," Roeser canvasses various versions of ethical intuitionism. One of the main conclusions of Moral Emotions and Intuitions is that affectual intuitionism is the most plausible form of intuitionism. Hence, one might have expected this chapter to outline different ways of defending the core elements of intuitionism, ways that compete with the affectual approach. Leading competitors include those intuitionists who claim that the relevant non-inferential moral beliefs are grounded in how things seem, or in independent non-cognitive affective states, or in adequately grasping self-evident truths. Rather than describing these versions of intuitionism, Roeser discusses several normative and metaethical views that one could hold in combination with intuitionism, views such as ethical monism or pluralism, consequentialism or non-consequentialism, skepticism or optimism about commonsense, and generalism or particularism. She devotes this second chapter to pointing out that none of these positions are essential to intuitionism. But, given how she defined intuitionism at the outset, this conclusion is hardly surprising.

Roeser responds, in chapter three, to a number of common objections to both moral realism and moral intuitionism. She joins other intuitionists in noting that many standard complaints with intuitionism rest on misunderstandings of the view. After dispensing with what she takes to be the strongest objections to intuitionism and moral realism, she turns her attention to the debate between moral particularists and generalists in chapter four. Endorsing Jonathan Dancy's arguments in favor of particularism, Roeser rejects the generalist idea that all morally relevant features, such as promise-keeping or beneficence, are invariably morally relevant. Roeser doubts that lying, for example, always counts morally against an action. As a particularist and an intuitionist, Roeser thinks that we can know facts about particular moral property instances, such as the fact that Smith's lie was morally required, without inferring them from general moral principles. She rejects rationalist forms of intuitionism in part because they seem unable to account of our non-inferential knowledge of particular, as opposed to merely general, moral facts. Roeser's point has merit, but only if you agree that intuitionists ought to include particular moral facts among the facts that are non-inferentially knowable.

The book's main action takes place in the fifth and final chapter, where Roeser proposes her own version of intuitionism. All intuitionists claim that some moral beliefs can be justified independently of inference. What is distinctive about her affectual intuitionism is the claim that these non-inferential moral beliefs are moral emotions.

Affectual intuitionists do not think that the relevant moral beliefs are based on emotional states. Rather, these non-inferential beliefs are themselves moral emotions. It is not inconsistent to hold that moral emotions are a species of moral belief because, Roeser reports, affectual intuitionists embrace a cognitive theory of emotion. For Roeser, a moral emotion is a complex cognitive state "constituted by a moral judgment, positive or negative affection for the persons (or acts or states of affairs) who are the intentional object of that judgment, and of an agreeable or disagreeable feeling in ourselves" (149). Cognitive moral emotions include anger, outrage, and sympathy, and they are, for affectual intuitionists, "felt value judgments" (138). Importantly, neither the feeling nor the judgment is to be prior to the other, since "feeling and judging cannot be separated; they are two sides of the same coin" (149). As Roeser explains,"Feeling the 'pangs' [of guilt] and judging that we did something wrong go hand in hand and cannot be separated. Together they constitute the emotion 'guilt'" (150). Here, the disagreeable feeling of guilt is taken to be "inherently intertwined" with our judgment of wrong-doing (174).

Roeser suggests that cognitive moral emotions, such as guilt or outrage, often are not held on the basis of premises. Hence, they are plausible candidates for intuitionism's class of basic, non-inferentially justified moral beliefs. Further, these moral emotions frequently respond to particular moral facts, such as concrete instances of wrong-doing. Finally, Roeser claims that our moral emotions represent justified beliefs about objective moral truths. Her argument for this latter claim rests on her endorsement of reliabilism about epistemic justification, together with her assertion that moral emotions are the result of a reliable belief-forming process.

To show that moral emotions are reliably formed, she provides examples in which our moral emotions appear to be sensitive to moral truths. She dismisses evolutionary debunking arguments that suggest that our moral emotions are unreliable. Yet, as is often the case in Moral Emotions and Intuitions, Roeser's response to these arguments proceeds too quickly. Evolutionary debunking arguments give us a reason to think that our moral emotional judgments do not reliably track objective moral facts by pointing out that our judgments were shaped by evolutionary forces, forces that appear not to be influenced by an objective moral realm. Roeser's reply to this concern is to point out that, even if our moral belief-forming processes have a purely evolutionary explanation, it is still possible that these processes reliably track objective moral truths (160-161). She fails, though, to offer any reason to think that this possibility is a reality, and as such, she leaves affectual intuitionism vulnerable to the objection at hand.

Let me close by highlighting other elements of Roeser's case for affectual intuitionism. As evidence for her position, she frequently cites the phenomenology of moral experience. Roeser claims that our moral beliefs appear to have an emotional element. Still, it is not obvious that moral phenomenology is decisively on her side. Many of our particular moral judgments seem to lack a felt emotional experience. Roeser would reply that the emotional element is there, only it has been weakened or overwhelmed by another mental state. Even if she is correct and intuitionistic moral judgments have an essential, affective element, more argument is needed to secure the stronger claim that this feeling is neither prior to, nor consequential upon, the moral judgment. Other non-affectual intuitionists have argued that moral judgments are non-inferentially grounded in prior affective states. It seems just as phenomenologically plausible that I first experience outrage, and subsequently base a moral belief upon this emotion. While Roeser considers this alternative way of developing intuitionism, she rejects the view without argument (148-149).

Roeser also emphasizes the role that emotion plays in moral thinking to lend further credence to construing intuitionistic beliefs as emotional felt judgments. She approvingly cites Margaret Little's observation that, if we lacked emotions, we would be blind to many morally relevant facts (135, 151). In the absence of having sympathetic feelings with others, for instance, we may not notice the neediness of an abandoned child, as well as the moral demand to intervene on the child's behalf. Moral emotions, Roeser tells us, "let us see salient features of situations that purely rational states would easily overlook" (150).

As should be clear, many of Roeser's opponents, both within and without the intuitionistic camp, can also agree that emotional tendencies allow us to appreciate the moral features of things. While Roeser dismisses rationalist intuitionism on the grounds that "it ignores the emotions" (xvi), she fails to recognize that even these intuitionists can make room for emotion's importance in moral thinking. Consider, for example, her affectual intuitionist account of how emotion is implicated in our knowledge of general moral principles, such as the principle that all human beings have equal worth. She writes, "However, an emotion such as sympathy can help us understand this principle. By feeling with and for another person, I understand that he or she has the same needs and rights as I do. Sympathy can broaden our perspective" (163). Many rationalist intuitionists hold that some moral truths, such as the above truth that all human beings have equal worth, are self-evident, and that we can know them by understanding them adequately. As Roeser here illustrates, having sympathy with others may "help us understand this principle," and rationalists will most certainly agree. She needs to show, not that having emotional feelings helps us acquire moral knowledge -- a relatively uncontroversial idea -- but that the relevant moral judgments themselves contain an ineliminable and essential emotional component. Roeser often slides from the first idea that emotional feelings allow us to appreciate moral saliencies to the position that non-inferential moral beliefs are complex unities of judgment and feeling. This is problematic, as merely citing the usefulness of emotion is not enough to establish the stronger claims of affectual intuitionism.

Moral Emotions and Intuitions raises important questions about the nature of moral cognition and emotion's role in moral thinking. For Roeser, the answers to such questions are to be found in affectual intuitionism. While I may not have found her case for affectual intuitionism wholly convincing, many of the positions she endorses are thought-provoking and worth consideration. Roeser point outs, correctly in my view, that a commitment to non-inferential moral knowledge is not as implausible as critics suppose and that intuitionism in ethics warrants serious attention.