Moral Emotions: Reclaiming the Evidence of the Heart

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Anthony J. Steinbock, Moral Emotions: Reclaiming the Evidence of the Heart, Northwestern University Press, 2014, 339pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780810129566.

Reviewed by John J. Drummond, Fordham University


Anthony Steinbock, in a series of recent works, has developed an original and unique phenomenological voice. In this book he brings that voice to a study of the moral emotions. He intends

to illustrate through the description of the moral emotions . . . how they have their own structure, their own kinds of evidence, their unique "cognitive" styles, and how they are revelatory of the person as interpersonal -- without them either somehow being tied to rationality, in order to be meaningful, or on the contrary, being ostracized from the sphere of evidence because they are not rational. (5)

He also views these analyses as ordered toward a broader aim: to develop an account of persons that addresses "the problems associated with 'modernity' and those encountered at the impasse of postmodernity" (3).

Steinbock adopts an approach to the emotions that is indebted to the work of Max Scheler. For Scheler, the emotions are revelatory of value -- and, indeed, of a hierarchy of values -- that are apprehended independently of logical reasoning and independently of the bearers of these values. This echoes Pascal's famous dictum: "Le cœur a ses raisons que la raison ne connaît point." As did Pascal and Scheler, Steinbock argues that this does not exclude the emotions from having their appropriate kind of evidence and thereby from participating in rationality, even if this rationality differs from that of the perceptual and judicative -- the logical -- domains.

Steinbock considers moral emotions under three headings: self-givenness (pride, shame, guilt), possibility (repentance, hope, despair), and  otherness (trust, loving, humility). He begins with the examination of pride. While focused on the self, pride is nevertheless an interpersonal experience, an emotion in which someone is given to herself in a dissembled manner that is not self-revelatory. It is not self-revelatory precisely because it cuts off the interpersonal dimension of one's being by excluding others from any credit in one's achievements. It is, in Steinbock's words, "a resistance to others and to their contributions to shared meaning in and through asserting myself as the only or the highest source of meaning. I am given to myself in pride as self-grounding" (35).

In this context, the other emotions of self-givenness -- shame and guilt -- function both as self-critique and as challenges to pride. Shame and guilt are diremptive experiences that clearly reveal the interpersonality of one's personhood. In shame "I am not only given as exposed before another, but as receiving myself from another" (76). Shame self-critically apprehends a loss of self-value, but, more importantly, shame reorients the self toward its positive value insofar as it motivates one to modify one's self-understanding of who one is. This self-revelation is what enables shame to serve as a critique of the prideful self, and its futurity points to a Myself as what I ought to be and can be. Shame thereby annuls pride and orients us toward an interpersonal (even if only myself and Myself) normativity. Guilt similarly involves a diremption, but guilt focuses not on what I am but what I did. I stand before you accused by you and responsible to you for what I have done and will do.

The futural dimension revealed in the diremptive experiences of shame and guilt motivates the consideration of the emotions of possibility. Repentance, Steinbock claims, liberates me from the fixed meanings of myself and my past deeds as they are revealed in shame and guilt. Repentance also, however, returns me to the Myself as not self-grounded, "liberates" me from pride, and thereby liberates me for self-revision as bound to others, that is, for reconciliation with others. Hope is more explicitly interpersonal, since it evokes a relation of dependence on others beyond even the Myself. Because the event for which I hope is beyond my own power, in hoping for that event, I experience a power greater than or beyond myself, a power on which I am dependent (ultimately, the inter-Personal, the Holy). Hope, consequently, cannot live alongside pride. Despair, the polar opposite of hope, undercuts the sustained possibility of a being more powerful than myself and thereby undercuts the ground of hope.

What characterizes the emotions of otherness is their explicit relation to others. Trust reveals the other in its freedom and transcendence as available to me, and trust is therefore always open to betrayal. Loving and humility are interrelated. While loving is a direct opening to another and focuses on the other, humility is this same openness to the other wherein the focus is on "how I spontaneously receive myself as Myself, that is, as who I am from another" (231). Humility, therefore, is a mode of self-givenness that contrasts with the self-givenness of pride, shame, or guilt, and it is a mode of self-givenness that provides the ultimate response to the "self-love" of pride insofar as it is a "self-loving" receipt of Myself that is grounded in the other. Humility provides the foundation for genuinely loving others, while loving others reciprocally provides the foundation for genuine self-love, that is, humility.

One need not agree with every detail of Steinbock's descriptions of the nine central emotions (as well as many other emotional phenomena) in order to appreciate the richness of his phenomenological descriptions. They are detailed and form a unity that paints a portrait of the person without constituting a "theoretical" account of the human person. Granting this, how are we to understand Steinbock's claim that the emotions have a distinctive kind of structure, rationality, and evidence? Are we to understand him to say that the emotions as such have an essential structure, or are we to understand him to say that each of the emotions discussed has its own kind of essential structure? He does not answer this question directly. What is clear is the kind of essential structure that they do not have, an intentional structure characterized by what Husserl called a noesis/noema correlation. To admit this, on Steinbock's view, would amount either to a reduction of the emotions to a perceptual/judicative experience or to the claim that the emotions are founded on and presuppose such experiences. But Steinbock gives no argument for this view, and it is important to note that there are competing claims that one can assert in a noetic/noematic structure, where the noema is understood as the intentional content of the experience, without committing oneself to a reductionist view of the emotions that he rightly seeks to avoid.

Steinbock's use of scare-quotes when speaking of the "intentionality" of the emotions suggests that the emotions are intentional in some sense other than the one rejected. Since his descriptions provide detailed accounts of the kinds of beliefs characteristic of the different moral emotions, and given the fact that he rejects strongly cognitivist (judgment- or belief-based) views of the emotions, how are we to understand the distinctive ("intentional") structure of the emotions? The answer is not clear. Given Steinbock's invocations of Scheler, one might think that Steinbock would turn to the feelings (as opposed to physiological changes) for this account, but he says little about the role of feelings in the emotions. Once again, his account of what is distinctive about the structure of the emotions is left vague and unclear.

Steinbock's selection of emotions raises a question about his principle of selection. All the chosen emotions have religious, as well as moral, significance. In this respect, the present book forms a piece with Steinbock's earlier work, especially Phenomenology and Mysticism (Indiana, 2007). Second, the selection points toward his larger desire to set out a view of the person that responds both to modern conceptions of rationality and to postmodern reactions thereto. This combination of understandable and reasonable motives, however, hides from view emotions that are undeniably moral. There is, for example, no mention of indignation as revelatory of and a response to injustice, or of compassion as revelatory of and a response to the underserved suffering of others. I do not mean to ask Steinbock to write a different book, but I do think these are surprising omissions in a book on the moral (as opposed to religious) emotions.

Steinbock rightly rejects views of the human person that do not fully value the independence of the affective and conative dimensions of human experience and concentrate instead on the perceptual and judicative dimensions. His book, insofar as it rejects views that define the emotions by reference either to perceptual or propositional content or to perceptual or propositional grounding, and argues that the intentionality of the emotions is essentially different from the intentionality of perceptual and judicative experiences, is, therefore, a sustained argument for this larger claim. It is in that sense that the book advances a new view of the human person and of the role of emotional rationality in our personal and social lives. The book is stimulating and provocative (in the best sense) and deserves to be widely read.