Moral Entanglements

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Henry S. Richardson, Moral Entanglements: The Ancillary-Care Obligations of Medical Researchers, Oxford University Press, 2012, 272pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195388930.

Reviewed by Joseph J. Fins, New York Presbyterian-Weill Cornell Medical Center


It is a rare occurrence when a new concept enters a field and bioethics is no exception. For decades our sensibilities about research ethics have been molded by historic abuses dating back to Nuremberg and Tuskegee, locales that have become synonymous with ethical transgressions when medicine went astray. And over the years, their legacy has been a regulatory posture of prohibitions, what researchers must not do. After Nuremberg they must neither violate the tenets of informed consent or voluntariness, nor subject individuals to interventions which are life-threatening or performed by personnel who might not otherwise be qualified to perform the same procedures in routine clinical practice. And after Tuskegee, investigators were not to misrepresent research as treatment and take advantage of the dispossessed and the poor whose only recourse to "therapy" might be through enrollment in a clinical trial. We were cautioned about promulgating a therapeutic misconception and taught to be judicious about study design, only engaging in research when we were truly in a state of ignorance, or what has been described as equipoise.

Although both the therapeutic misconception and equipoise have come under critical reappraisal, they have typified a period of restrictive research regulation that emerged in the wake of the transgressions of the past century. Each was a kind of prohibition to limit what the researcher might do or say. In the case of the therapeutic misconception it was to prevent misrepresentation of research as therapy. In the case of equipoise, it was to avoid experimentation when the outcome might already be known. Both were period pieces reflecting the need to avoid excess, inducements or cavalier practices in the shadow of truly horrific abuses.

To this legacy we now add a fundamentally new concept which speaks not of what must not be done but rather of what should be done, the affirmative moral obligation of investigators who conduct research to provide ancillary care, medical care or services not directly related to the conduct of a trial. In Moral Entanglements Henry S. Richardson has added a new conceptual framework to research ethics.

As the author notes in his conclusion, the "practical neglect of the issue of ancillary care seems to have been accompanied by a widely shared theoretical blind spot." But Richardson has remedied that error of omission and left us with a fine volume that will be a touchstone for future scholarship and regulation. It is an inspired and highly readable analysis.

Richardson's work has been informed by the moral intuitions of clinical investigators, many of whom have conducted research in resource poor places in the developing world. Many have wanted to do more, to not stand idly by as research subjects suffered ills outside the narrow scope of clinical studies. He cites the example of attending to the needs of parasitic co-infection in patients in an HIV transmission study, who might otherwise go untreated. Before Richardson's ancillary care obligation argument, such co-infections might have simply been understood as ones incidentally discovered. But Richardson argues that their discovery in the context of research matters and conveys an obligation upon the investigator that is morally binding. These obligations supplant general obligations that exist more broadly in society, such as the duty to rescue, which is not dependent upon an ancillary care argument.

It is a cogent theory of moral entanglement in which he ties the obligations of the investigator to the privacy waiver, which first enables the research through informed consent. Importantly, this waiver is more than the granting of permission to participation in a study. Richardson argues that this lifting of the veil of privacy, draws the investigator into a distinctive set of obligations which is more compelling than anything suggested by one's impartial duties. Instead these responsibilities are grounded in the specificity of the research task and its particularities. More specifically it is based upon the partial entrustment that stems from the privacy waiver that first enables the research to occur under the doctrine of informed consent. Through this partial entrustment, subjects entrust some part of their health information to researchers and this leads to both a duty to warn and a "specifiable duty of beneficence."

Throughout the book, Richardson provides evocative examples to illustrate his point. To flesh out the relationship of privacy waivers and partial entrustment, he offers the story of "The Old Man and the Groceries." Simply told, you notice an elderly man at the grocery store unable to carry his bags. You offer to help. He accepts and then invites you up to his apartment. When you arrive, you find squalor. Richardson argues that you cannot simply walk away but have some responsibility because even this implicit acceptance of the old man's privacy rights confers an obligation upon you.

But what exactly is the depth of this obligation? What are its gradations? Is it merely a duty to warn or something more? Richardson argues that the more intimate the relationship the more one is compelled to do. In an evocative phrase, he notes that "the creation of intimacies tends to cancel moral inhibitions on the duty to warn." That is once, the old man lets you into his home, and lets you move from a public to more intimate space, your obligations become greater.

Returning to the partial entrustment of information: because that exchange is limited, so too is the extent of the investigator's reciprocal obligations to the subject. The scope of these obligations is determined by what emerges as a consequence of these permissions. Because investigators asked for and accepted information they effectively become encumbered by responsibilities related to this new knowledge, much like promissory obligations that occur between two willing individuals entering a relationship. But unlike prenuptials these ancillary care obligations cannot be waived in advance by the subject because of the inherent unequal knowledge base of subject versus researcher. The superior knowledge of the latter would provide her with greater knowledge of potential needs and outcomes than the vulnerable subject. For this reason, Richardson calls for restraint when it comes to an argument for a prospective waiver.

Beyond this rather categorical prohibition, the scope and strength of ancillary care obligations are in fact circumscribed by practical and conceptual concerns. Practically, ancillary care obligations have to be limited so as not to be overly "burdening [to] the helper" and not to preclude the conduct of important and valued research.

Conceptually, these obligations are demarcated by context. Most critical is the subject's vulnerability to the presence or absence of ancillary care and dependence upon the research team for services. To this is added the degree of engagement between the investigator and the subject. Has the investigator known this patient for years or is the patient someone known simply through a screening process? To summate these factors, as they would relate to ancillary care obligations, priority would be given to an impoverished subject otherwise without medical care who has had a long-term relationship with the research team and found stricken with a dire but treatable condition over a second subject who was less sick, less medically dependent, and whose contact with investigators had been more episodic.

In Richardson's framework, ancillary duties are not simply grounded in distributive justice because these duties are too general for such claims. Instead, invoking prioritarianism, he asserts that justice can reinforce the legitimacy of ancillary care obligations. Those most deserving of ancillary care will be individuals who are least advantaged and thus unable to receive it elsewhere. Contrast this with a subject in the developed world who volunteered to participate in a brain imaging study and was found to have an asymptomatic incidental finding. This subject is highly educated, has health insurance and has a supportive family. The ancillary care obligations to this subject might simply be advice to see a neurologist, much less a specific referral. This individual would be far less dependent upon the research team for care and guidance than the subject who was profoundly disadvantaged.

My only critique of Moral Entanglements is its near exclusive focus on research conducted in the developing world. As an investigator who is part of a team conducting research on highly marginalized patients with severe brain injury in the United States, I found Richardson's theory of ancillary care obligations enlightening and reassuring. It reinforced my sense of the justness of helping "our" patients and families receive better diagnostic and rehabilitative services. It also helped me overcome the rigid dichotomies that segregate the roles of subject and patient and that of investigator and physician. If ancillary care obligations allow clinical investigators to sometimes step out of their research role and act as physicians, Richardson has helped meet the needs of subjects who are simultaneously patients.

Moral Entanglements is a highly cogent and compassionate argument that has already altered how I perceive my obligations to patients and subjects. I suspect it will fundamentally alter how we conceptualize and regulate research both at the bedside and in policy considerations. Its influence will inform the interactions of researchers and subjects, the way we write informed consent documents and how we formulate budgets for research. Notwithstanding federal prohibitions which prevent the diversion of extra-territorial research dollars to non-research uses, it is now imperative upon those who would maintain the status quo to refute Richardson's arguments that the provision of ancillary care is not discretionary but obligatory. The same strictures would seem to hold true for Non-governmental Organizations (NGOs) such as the Gates Foundation.

The likely influence of this volume is in part due to Richardson's careful logic. But it is also due to something more, the humility and humanity that infuse his argumentation. He acknowledges his debts to collaborators, treats opposing viewpoints respectfully and concludes with a call for empirical validation of his theoretical claims. Beyond its substantive contributions to medical ethics, Moral Entanglements is also a lesson is scholarly civility. When Richardson concludes by suggesting that his readers have now entered into a "special obligation" charged with refining and deepening his arguments, we get the sense he means it and look forward to a constructive moral entanglement with the author of this landmark volume.