Moral Error Theory: History, Critique, Defence

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Jonas Olson, Moral Error Theory: History, Critique, Defence, Oxford University Press, 2014, 214pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198701934.

Reviewed by Daan Evers, University of Groningen


Olson's book is a defence of moral error theory, embellished with discussion of historical precedents to John Mackie. It is divided into three parts, History, Critique and Defence, which I will discuss in turn.

Part I: History

The first part, although interesting in itself, is not essential to the rest of the book. Olson discusses a number of historical precursors to Mackie. These precursors needn't think that moral language is defective, for Olson distinguishes between standard and moderate error theories. Standard error theories claim that some area of thought and discourse D involves systematically false beliefs, as a result of which D-judgements are uniformly untrue (which means they are either false or neither true nor false). Moderate error theories attribute systematic error to thought about D, but deny that this leads to untrue claims. Moderate error theorists thus think that the error does not infect the semantics of D-claims or presuppositions relevant to their truth values.

Two of the historical figures that Olson discusses were (or may have been) moderate error theorists: the Swedish philosopher Axel Hägerström and David Hume. Hägerström thought that moral claims are uniformly untrue and that ordinary speakers have false beliefs about moral discourse, but not that moral claims are untrue because of these false beliefs. Instead, Hägerström thought moral claims were neither true nor false because he was a kind of expressivist.

Olson argues that Hume held that some speakers have mistaken beliefs about the nature of moral properties. Ordinary speakers would take such properties to be mind-independent, whereas they are in fact response-dependent. Olson argues that these are claims about the nature of moral properties as opposed to the meaning of moral terms, and wants to remain neutral about Hume's position on the latter (he thinks Hume may not have had a clear view about semantics). Somewhat confusingly, however, Olson also seems to claim that Hume proposed a reform of actual moral thought and discourse (p. 40, p. 42), suggesting that Hume was a standard error theorist.

Apart from some minor expository issues, Part I is clear and enjoyable. Olson discusses moral error theories by Hägerström, Einar Tegen, Bertrand Russell, Ludwig Wittgenstein, Richard Robinson and Mackie prior to his (1977). One aspect of the discussion seems noteworthy to me, though.

Russell appealed to theoretical economy in his rejection of a property of objective goodness. Olson notes that a realist could reply that we are justified in assuming such a property, because the idea that moral judgements are uniformly false is extremely counterintuitive. He continues that debunking explanations of the sense of objectivity may undermine this style of argument, but adds that

further arguments are required in order to cast serious doubt on objective moral properties. Moral realists may query why theories that assume only positive and negative attitudes that we mistake for perceptions of objective moral properties are more economical than theories that assume perceptions of instantiated objective moral properties, especially when we take into consideration the fact that some moral judgements seem obviously true. (pp. 63-64)

Olson concludes that skeptics should isolate a problematic feature of moral properties, such as their queerness, to bolster the appeal to theoretical economy.

This is not clear to me. Once we have a sufficiently plausible debunking explanation of the sense of truth and objectivity (an explanation that does not appeal to the existence of moral facts), considerations of theoretical economy appear to count. Furthermore, Olson later argues (in Part II) that the idea that moral facts are queer itself leads to a stalemate (some people may not find anything queer about moral properties). In order to break the stalemate, he appeals to debunking explanations of moral thought and discourse, and theoretical economy (Occam's razor makes an appearance on p. 147). This way of proceeding seems entirely correct to me, but it makes the criticism of Russell seem unfair.

Part II: Critique

The title of Part II is not entirely apt, as it contains more than a critique of arguments for moral error theory. It also contains a defence of one version of the argument from queerness.

Olson distinguishes queerness arguments (arguments for the conclusion that moral facts are queer) from the argument from queerness. The latter is an argument for the conclusion that moral facts do not exist. Olson thinks the argument from queerness has two steps: (1) an identification of queer features of moral facts and (2) explanations of moral thought and discourse that do not appeal to moral facts. These two feats would warrant the conclusion that it is, all things considered, more plausible that there are no moral facts.

Olson distinguishes four different queerness arguments, focusing on supervenience, knowledge, motivation and irreducible normativity. He thinks all except the last are unsuccessful. It should be borne in mind that these arguments are aimed at ethical non-naturalism, the view that there are non-natural moral facts. Mackie rejected expressivism and naturalism on different grounds.

The first queerness argument: supervenience

Some of Mackie's claims suggest he thought there was something queer about the fact that moral properties supervene on natural (and/or supernatural) properties. Take utilitarianism, according to which an action is morally right iff it maximizes happiness. Utilitarianism entails that the property of maximizing happiness is necessarily co-instantiated with the distinct property of being right. But according to Hume's Dictum, necessary coextension implies property identity.

Olson argues that Hume's Dictum is controversial, and that basing an error theory on this principle would make the fate of moral error theory depend on the truth of a general thesis in metaphysics. This would be undesirable.

However, Tristram McPherson thinks that, even if Hume's Dictum is false, a commitment to brute necessary connections between distinct properties still counts against a view. But Olson argues that what McPherson means by 'brute' is inexplicable, and it would not be inexplicable why certain moral properties (say, rightness) supervene on certain natural properties (say, maximizing happiness). These facts can be explained by certain moral principles (say, that maximizing happiness is the one and only property that makes actions right).

Olson is aware that people may object that ethical principles merely state (rather than explain) necessary connections between moral and natural properties. Furthermore, non-naturalists are also committed to the claim that certain natural properties make actions right or wrong. This making-relation may require explanation. Olson's response on behalf of non-naturalism is that there is no explanation of the fact that maximizing happiness, say, has the property of being right-making. It is a brute, sui generis feature. If one finds this problematic, it must be because of some general worry about sui generis non-natural properties and facts. If so, then the supervenience of the moral on the non-moral plays no special role in the queerness argument. As before, Olson thinks it would be more convincing to have an argument specifically aimed at moral facts and properties, one that does not generalize to other domains.

Second queerness argument: moral knowledge

This is an argument from moral knowledge. There would be something queer about knowledge of the fact that a natural property makes actions right or wrong. Olson analyses this challenge as a general concern about synthetic a priori knowledge. In that case, however, the argument lacks force, as much philosophical knowledge appears to be synthetic a priori (e.g., the knowledge that there are no abstract objects).

Third queerness argument: motivation

This argument depends on the claim that knowledge of moral facts would guarantee that the subject of that knowledge is motivated. Olson reconstructs Mackie's argument in a way that is charitable and locates the alleged queerness in moral facts and properties in particular, without generalizing to other domains. However, even Olson's best reconstruction depends on the idea that moral facts guarantee moral motivation, and it is far from clear that this is conceptually (or actually) true. So this argument can be resisted.

Fourth queerness argument: irreducible normativity

This is the only argument with force, in Olson's view:

(P1) Moral facts entail that there are facts that favour certain courses of behaviour, where the favouring relation is irreducibly normative.

(P2) Irreducibly normative favouring relations are queer.

(C1) Hence, moral facts entail queer relations.

(P3) If moral facts entail queer relations, moral facts are queer.

(C2) Hence, moral facts are queer. (pp. 123-124)

Saying that a fact favours some act irreducibly means that its favouring does not consist in the fact's explaining why the act is conducive to desire satisfaction, or to compliance with norms, or to fulfilment of some role.

The fourth argument generalizes to the normative, but not to non-normative domains. If it works, then all normative facts that consist in or entail irreducible favouring relations would be queer.

A crucial premise is (P1), which Olson calls the conceptual claim. It says that moral facts are or entail irreducibly normative favouring relations. The claim is partly motivated by the (purported) fact that people tend to pursue moral arguments even with people they take not to share their fundamental moral views. We would do this with the aim of convincing others that they are wrong, which would suggest that we take moral judgements to be absolute rather than relativized.

Stephen Finlay (2008) calls this kind of evidence for the conceptual claim disputation evidence. He argues that there may be little of it, as we would rarely meet anyone who shares none or even few of our values. So most debates can be explained by the hypothesis that we assume that others share enough relevant values. That is compatible with a contextualist semantics according to which moral claims are implicitly relativized to the values or standards of speakers.

Olson responds that Finlay underestimates the prevalence of fundamental moral disagreement in many current societies: 'Even a cursory glance at public political debate in many countries will reveal fundamental moral disagreements between conservatives and feminists; socialists and neo-liberals; cosmopolitans and nationalists; etc' (p. 128). This response strikes me as weak. It is by no means clear that feminists and conservatives, socialists and neo-liberals, or even vegetarians and speciesists share so few values that our tendency to have an argument could not be explained by the assumption that enough values are shared for fruitful engagement.

Olson also argues that evolutionary considerations favour the conceptual claim. He thinks moral thought and language evolved to coordinate and regulate behaviour. They would fulfil this function better if they came with a commitment to irreducibly normative reasons than if moral propositions reduced to propositions about what would be conducive to ends or in accordance with standards. This is not obvious to me. The idea is that irreducible reasons are objective, and that objective reasons are a better motivator (and deterrent) that non-objective reasons. Three observations are relevant here. First, Olson seems to accept Shaun Nichols's (2004) claim that moral judgement is strongly backed by emotion. Surely emotion is a much better motivator than beliefs in objectivity. Can such beliefs create enough additional pressure to support an evolutionary argument for a claim about semantics? Second, it is not clear that objectivity is in fact a motivating force. Imagine that someone believed the rules of etiquette were not man-made. Would that person be more inclined to follow those rules? Perhaps, but perhaps not. I think it would depend on whether her environment sanctioned their observance. Third, Olson is attracted to the idea that moral claims pragmatically convey imperatives. Their motivating power may depend on this pragmatic implication.

The remainder of Olson's defence of the conceptual claim is a critique of the idea that moral statements are always indexed to standards. If they were, then claims about the correctness of moral standards should also be indexed to standards. Take the statement: 'Utilitarianism is the correct moral standard'. If utilitarianism is our deepest moral commitment (a commitment that cannot be derived from other moral values), then it seems the claim must be understood as a tautology: 'Utilitarianism is correct in the light of/relative to utilitarianism'. Olson raises four objections to this idea. (1) People who claim that utilitarianism is the correct moral standard do not think they are merely stating a tautology. (2) People tend to think that moral standards can be mistaken, but if 'any claim to the effect that some fundamental moral statement is correct is trivially true . . . there is no such thing as an incorrect fundamental moral standard' (p. 133). (3) People tend to believe that utilitarians and deontologists disagree about the truth value of the same proposition, but the standard-relational approach entails that this is false. (4) People tend to think that claims about the correctness of moral standards are informative, unobvious truths or falsehoods.

The force of these objections depends (among other things) on the extent to which contextualists can reasonably say that it need not be apparent to speakers that the truth conditions of claims about the correctness of standards are trivial. In (2014), I argue that they can, since standards can be thought about obliquely. For example, when speakers wonder what the correct moral standard is, they may in fact wonder what standards to adopt in light of the (i.e., their) most fundamental values. The claim: 'Utilitarianism is the correct moral standard in light of the most fundamental moral values' does not seem trivial, even if these values amount to utilitarianism.

So I am not yet convinced that there is sufficient evidence for the conceptual claim. But even if there were, one may wonder why irreducible favouring relations would be queer at all. Surprisingly, Olson says that non-naturalists may (reasonably) deny that there is anything queer about them. However, the availability of explanations of moral thought in which no appeal is made to irreducible reasons would give the error theorist the advantage. This leaves me with the sense that queerness is not doing any work in the argument against non-natural moral facts after all.

Part III: Defence

In Part III, Olson responds to objections to the error theory. Some of the more important ones arise from the fact that epistemic reasons also appear to involve irreducible favouring relations. If so, then one may wonder whether an error theory would entail that there are no reasons to believe anything (including the error theory), or that no one's beliefs are better justified than anyone else's. Olson is willing to concede (at least for the sake of argument) that epistemic ought and reason claims are or entail claims about irreducible favouring relations. But this would not show that there are no epistemic reasons. First, 'epistemic reason' is ambiguous between evidence and reason for belief. Olson argues that the notion of evidence is not normative: evidence for a proposition p is a fact that reliably indicates that p. Such facts can exist even if there are no irreducible reasons for belief. Furthermore, evidence can give us hypothetical reasons to believe the error theory (reasons based on the aim of having true beliefs), or reasons based on one's role as a metaethicist or metaepistemologist. These reasons are reducible, and so not metaphysically suspect.

Olson further responds to normativists about belief (who think it is constitutive of the attitude of belief that it is subject to certain norms), to Bart Streumer's claim that we cannot believe the error theory and David Enoch's argument that the practice of deliberation would commit us to the existence of irreducibly normative favouring relations.

In the final chapter, Olson asks what we should do if the error theory is true. He rejects the abolition of moral language on the grounds that it is not clear that its use is more harmful than beneficial. He rejects fictionalism on the grounds that its benefits are unclear and because it would be psychologically costly (one has to combat the tendency to believe moral claims). He recommends the continuation of moral assertion and belief in practical contexts and a skeptical stance in critical contexts, such as the seminar room. The advantage of making moral assertions would be that they pragmatically convey imperatives, and the advantage of having genuine moral beliefs would consist in the fact that they would bolster self-control in situations of temptation.


I enjoyed reading Olson's book. It is interesting and clearly written, suitable both for upper-level undergraduates and more advanced students of philosophy. The discussion is sharp and Olson rarely overlooks a problem. I can recommend it unreservedly.


Nichols, S. (2004), Sentimental Rules, New York: Oxford University Press.

Finlay, S. (2008), "The Error in the Error Theory", Australasian Journal of Philosophy 86: 347-69.

Evers, D. (2014), "Moral Contextualism and the Problem of Triviality", Ethical Theory and Moral Practice 17: 285-297.

Mackie (1977), Ethics: Inventing Right and Wrong, Harmondsworth: Penguin Books.

McPherson, T. (2009), "Ethical Non-Naturalism and the Metaphysics of Supervenience", in: Oxford Studies in Metaethics 7, edited by R. Shafer-Landau. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 205-34.