Moral Evil in Practical Ethics

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Shlomit Harrosh and Roger Crisp (eds.), Moral Evil in Practical Ethics, Routledge, 2019, 249pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138316041.

Reviewed by Avery Kolers, University of Louisville


Close to the midpoint of this profound collection, Gideon Calder quotes a 1946 letter from Hannah Arendt to Karl Jaspers:

We have to combat all impulses to mythologize the horrible, and to the extent that I can't avoid [doing so], I haven't understood what actually went on. (141)

Philosophical theorizing about evil is undergoing a widely hailed renaissance, one that dates to the late 1990s as scholars sought to come to grips with the lessons of the 20th Century even as 'Western' responses to violence in Rwanda and the former Yugoslavia made a mockery of the phrase "never again." The ten original essays in this anthology do not all agree on how to combat their "impulses to mythologize," nor are they all equally successful in doing so. But the depth of their explorations and the details of their disagreements reveal the fecundity of this 20-year-old renaissance. Unfortunately, for reasons of space, this review cannot discuss every essay.

The editors have divided the chapters into four groups: "The Concept of Evil" (two essays), "Individuals and Evil" (three), "Evil Beyond the Individual" (three), and "Responses to Evil" (two).

The papers in the initial section -- Eve Garrard and David McNaughton's "How to Theorise about Evil" and Steve Clarke's "A Religious Conception of Evil" -- are less about "the concept of evil" than about whether there is even a subject of study here, and if so, how to know what it is. Speaking as secular moral realists, Garrard and McNaughton propose a methodology for defining "evil." Unsurprisingly, they adopt reflective equilibrium: to work back and forth between accounts of the appropriate response to evil acts, and accounts of what features of the evil acts were such as to warrant that response (21). They propose that "moral horror" is the appropriate response, and hence that evil acts are those that warrant moral horror (22). They do not attempt to explain which features warrant that response. And although they rely essentially on distinctions between acts that warrant and those that evoke moral horror, and between moral and nonmoral horror (23), they provide no accounts of these distinctions. Thus although this first essay seems intended as an agenda-setting essay for future work on the subject, its main thrust is simply to defend reflective equilibrium for this context.

More productive is Clarke's chapter. Defining religion sociologically (40), he understands religiously evil actions as those that either help a posited supernatural being act on its persistent hostility toward some social group with which a speaker sympathizes, or that attempt to thwart a posited supernatural being's persistent benevolence toward such a social group (44-5). This account is relativistic insofar as supernatural beings are conceived as allied with particular groups, but is universalistic whenever a supernatural being is posited as universally benevolent, as in Christianity and Islam (45). Clarke's account is particularly valuable inasmuch as it is likely that most people around the world, including most educated people who are not philosophers of evil, think of evil in religious terms. It is unfortunate, however, that the chapter and its concerns are ignored by the other contributors and that  Clarke does not gesture toward further questions where his account might be put to productive use.

The two middle sections take up questions about the social contexts that make evil possible or likely, and the role of social concepts in understanding evil acts. I found particularly interesting analyses of two phenomena that have traditionally been analyzed individualistically: Robin May Schott's analysis of bullying and Arne Johan Vetlesen's of murderous violence. Similarly stimulating are Claudia Card's and Stephen de Wijze's attempts to account for societal-scale evils.

Drawing on research on schoolyard violence, Schott asks, "Is Bullying Evil?" Though she answers with a qualified "yes" (59), her principal aim here is to reject a "paradigm" of thinking about bullying that locates the wrongdoing in an individual bully, "naturalizes" the bully's aggression, and ascribes weakness to the victim (64). Schott prefers a "social orientation" that locates the source of bullying in "social exclusion anxiety" which, when "activated," "moves towards social panic," whereupon "empathy evaporates and contempt increases, thereby opening the path for actions often recognised as bullying" (72). In other words, when our fear of social exclusion bubbles over, "bullying becomes a manoeuvre to secure one's position" in a group. Bullying can thus be effectively addressed only if we both help children process their anxiety and zoom out to "larger social conditions" (74) to discern what creates these anxieties and raises their stakes in the first place. Schott's analysis implies that anti-bullying measures that work only by preaching nonviolence or punishing individual offenders will be ineffective if not counterproductive. Less clear, however, is what sorts of measures might work instead, given the scope of the problem.

Vetlesen's "Narratives of Entitlement" analyzes the case of Anders Behring Breivik, who single-handedly terrorized Norway in 2011 when he bombed a government complex in Oslo, killing eight people, and then systematically murdered 69 people, most of them children, at a Labour Party summer camp (81). Horror aside, what is philosophically challenging here is holding Breivik accountable for his actions even while acknowledging that in the years leading up to them he had "gradually lost a full grasp of reality" (80) as, influenced by right-wing tracts, he retreated into social isolation interrupted only by online chats with like-minded individuals worldwide. Vetlesen grants that Breivik "drifted towards madness," but denies that he was unaccountably insane (82-3), because "it is a drift [Breivik] himself initiated and for which he remains morally responsible" (80).

Vetlesen explains Breivik's evil, and hence his moral accountability, in Hegelian terms. For Hegel in the Philosophy of Right, "subjectivity is . . . evil" when, and because, "everything is made to refer solely to conviction" rather than to an objective or even intersubjective realm of "rights, duties and laws."[1] Hegelian evil is thus "subjectivity gone amok" (95). But why does subjectivity run amok? Vetlesen explains this process as an extreme form of sour grapes, where the agent scorns those who have rejected him (96). Like Schott's, Vetlesen's analysis seems to imply that the solution to evil acts -- if there is one -- must lie in rethinking social relationships so that bullies and fanatics do not find themselves alone and stewing in their anxiety or envy. We should not expect a more extreme enforcement regime to do the trick.

By contrast, in her brilliant and sadly posthumous "Surviving Homophobia," Card endorses enhanced penalties for hate crimes. She applies Jeremy Waldron's account of the harm of hate speech to the case of hate crimes, specifically analyzing narratives of women who survived brutal attacks that may have been homophobic, misogynist, or anti-Semitic hate crimes (156). What Waldron's discussion suggests is that hate crimes are not just bias-driven attacks on persons or groups, but -- in their excessive brutality -- function as recruiting calls, assuring anyone who harbors such feelings "that they are not alone and that together they may be able to rid society of perverts" (157). Insofar as the state fails to controvert and repudiate these messages, they can create an "evil environment" -- that is, an environment "permeated by credible threats of harm to anyone who is or might be perceived as [a target group member] or supportive of" them (157).

For the victims and targets of evil environments, "surviving" is more likely to mean "being undefeated so far" rather than "outliving" (158). Card concludes by reflecting on the "moral costs" of remaining undefeated. Such costs -- exemplified by remaining closeted -- may include becoming one of Primo Levi's "grey figures: those who are targets of evil but also complicit in maintaining that evil."[2] She expresses skepticism regarding the strategies of violence (161) and "separatism" (160), and ultimately prefers the "most promising strategy for surviving homophobia -- that of Ellen DeGeneres and Harvey Milk -- [namely] to work on changing the environment from one that is evil to one that is respectful and safe . . . in short, to make it possible that at least some of us will actually outlive homophobia" (162).

Another, less successful, account of pervasive evil is de Wijze's "Political Evil -- Warping the Moral Landscape". Though his definitions are imprecise, de Wijze's concern seems not to be evil environments in Card's sense but ideologically informed spasms of state or organized paramilitary violence such as those perpetrated by the Nazis, the Khmer Rouge, the Hutu Akazu, and others (172, 178). How are these spasms to be "normatively explained" (177)? De Wijze casts some doubt on the adequacy of accounts that are merely aggregative (171-3), that explain evil by reference to "Malevolent Individuals" (173-5), or that are purely "situational" (175-6) such as the well-known Zimbardo experiments. Though de Wijze grants that these may partly explain the phenomenon, he doubts that they can explain the "normative background to such horrific events" (177). That normative background is "political evil": "malevolent and deleterious political values, ideas and aspirations that frame social horizons, and the context within which reality is interpreted" (177). Political evil is founded in evil ideologies (178) that i) warp the moral landscape (179-83), and ii) license or demand "the pursuit of unlimited power and domination" (183-4). The warped moral landscape is the key idea.

De Wijze defines "moral landscape" as "the fundamental moral preconditions needed for the development and sustenance of a decent and civilised society" (178). Evil ideologies warp it in two stages: first, by altering the "rules of moral salience (RMS)" (180, citing Barbara Herman), and second, through "the ideologically motivated gross perversion of facts that feed into the normative principles" (181).

This analysis, plausible and suggestive on the surface, must confront two important problems. First, de Wijze claims not just to be describing but explaining political evil. Although he peppers his discussion with causal verbs, he never explains what he means by "normative explanation" or how it relates to causal explanation. Moreover, de Wijze's own account fails by this very criterion, as he never seeks to explain how, when, or why evil ideologies emerge and succeed at warping the moral landscape. The causal question is at most pushed back a step. Second, although de Wijze is trying to explain large-scale atrocities, this generates a questionable dichotomy between normal times and times of evil. One doubts we have ever inhabited a society where the moral landscape was not warped; settler colonialism and patriarchy, for instance, seem at least arguably to constitute what Card calls evil environments. Consequently, the evil ideologies that de Wijze describes as successful often emerge from genuine grievances that -- though no doubt distorted by opportunists -- have their own roots in previous political evils (e.g., Serb Nationalism in Tito's authoritarian repression, Hutu extremism in colonialism and caste domination). Finally, inasmuch as a warped moral landscape is a property of the empirical background conditions, de Wijze's account seems to be a version of a situational theory. Yet he does not discuss such accounts in enough depth, or revisit them at the end, to explain what distinguishes his own account from situational theories. Thus de Wijze's proposal seems to fail by its own lights, even as he raises some very interesting issues.

Part IV -- "Responses to Evil" -- contains two essays that go in strikingly different directions. Luke Russell proposes a tight connection between "Evil and the Unforgivable," a connection that carries moral weight because if, or when, an evil is in fact unforgivable, it would be morally wrong to forgive it. Forgiveness is conceptually complex because it seems to be an agent-relative entitlement to forgive person-act pairs -- to forgive S-for-A'ing (211), or even for the part of that A-ing that targeted specific victim T. And whether T is entitled to forgive (or refuse to forgive) S seems not to be determined by whether S deserves forgiveness (212-3). Moreover, something that is unforgivable may be so "as things stand" or "come what may" (211).

Russell focuses on evil actions committed by evil persons, that is, those who are "strongly disposed to perform evil actions when placed in autonomy-favoring conditions" (204). Such persons, presumably, would act evilly even when not in a "situational" setting such as an evil environment or warped moral landscape. The problem with forgiving evil persons is that doing so -- particularly if forgiveness carries legal consequences -- gives them the opportunity to re-offend, and by hypothesis they are strongly disposed to do so if given the chance. To forgive the evil actions of evil persons is thus excessively risky, and even past victims are not entitled to impose this risk on potential future victims (217).

I have three concerns about Russell's interesting thesis. First, the moral psychology of forgiveness might be such that some people need to forgive in order to move on. Denying them the right to forgive may be a further undeserved burden, a harm or wrong in itself. Second, Russell assumes that desert is always backward-looking in the sense that one can deserve something only on the basis of past acts that merited it. David Schmidtz has defended a forward-looking conception of desert, such that one can come to deserve past treatment.[3] Think of the underprepared job candidate on whom you take a chance and who strives to deserve the opportunity. Russell does not consider forward-looking desert, or more importantly, the possibility that forgiveness can be productive of the moral reform to which it responds. Finally, on this point, I wonder whether we could ever know, until much later, that a person was actually an "evil person" in Russell's sense -- that is, that their disposition to evil was actually strong and unwavering. If we cannot know someone to be an "evil person," are we not -- on pain of becoming the very thing we detest -- at least permitted, if not obligated, to give her the chance to prove the reality of her apparent moral reform, indeed to come to deserve the forgiveness we give her? These seem to me particularly difficult questions, encompassing the moral worthiness not just of (former) perpetrators but also would-be forgivers.

Finally, Shlomit Harrosh's "Evildoing and Moral Enhancement: The Magnitude Question" is an interesting discussion of the possibility and value of biological or pharmacological moral enhancement to reduce evil motivations. She considers the possibility that we might have an obligation to undertake moral enhancement in order to reduce the likelihood that future people will perpetrate great evils or stand by as such evils occur. This sounds like a small bit of sci-fi, but it ends up being a profound reflection on the nature of morality and the "moral point of view" (237). Whereas most of the contributors accept that evil is in a moral class by itself, and hence that preventing or ending it takes priority over other immoral situations, Harrosh puts a boundary on this claim. Consequently she denies that we should "all try to make it psychologically difficult if not impossible for us to fail to do what morality requires when it comes to evildoing" (237). The concluding essay thus puts evil in its place in a way that I think Russell's essay does not.

Overall, the essays provide profound and troubling reflections on questions that are not only major concerns of our times but also a flourishing area of investigation in moral philosophy. Nonetheless, or indeed, more worrying for precisely that reason, the collection as a whole has some important gaps. A glaring one is the lack of a separate section on preventing or mitigating evil. Harrosh points in the direction of this challenge but the other essays really do not. Another gap is the Eurocentrism of the pieces. There are lots and lots of Nazis here, but very few conquistadors, imperialists, slave traders, settler-colonialists, lynch mobs, atomic-bombers, factory-farmers, drone-warriors, or climate-changers. This omission cannot be explained by the adoption of "the atrocity paradigm," because some of these acts and structures are indeed atrocities. Moreover, some of these atrocities pervade contemporary life in a way that, for instance, Nazism does not, and hence may be harder for us to recognize as evils. If a judgment seems obvious when applied to Nazis but not when applied to climate-changers, this may be because we are self-interested, but it may also be because we remain in the grip of "impulses to mythologize the horrible."

[1] Vetlesen, 93, quoting G.W.F. Hegel, Elements of the Philosophy of Right, Cambridge University Press, 1991, 184, 182; S. 140, 140 Addition.

[2] Card, 160, quoting Primo Levi, The Drowned and the Saved, Vintage, 1989, 36-9.

[3] David Schmidtz, "How to Deserve," Political Theory 30 (2002), 774-799.