Moral Failure: On the Impossible Demands of Morality

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Lisa Tessman, Moral Failure: On the Impossible Demands of Morality, Oxford University Press, 2015, 281pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199396146.

Reviewed by Vanessa Carbonell, University of Cincinnati


Sometimes you can't help but judge a book by its cover. The ominously beautiful cover of Lisa Tessman's book betrays the argument within. A square 1941 charcoal drawing by German artist Käthe Kollwitz depicts a scene of desperation: a parent huddling over three children to protect them from some unseen harm, her strong forearms and elbows jutting out defensively, their tiny heads burrowing into her clothing. (Most will see the parent as a mother, but it could easily be a father.) The title and subtitle are rendered in severe block letters, all caps -- MORAL FAILURE -- in raincloud gray set against a dreary matte blue. This book haunted me for weeks as it sat on my dining room table. I was almost afraid to read it. What are these children hiding from? Are the demands of morality impossible? Are we all doomed to fail? Frankly, I was not sure I wanted to know.

It turns out that this bold, methodically argued book delivers fully on the promise of its threatening cover. Tessman's thesis is that there are some things that morality requires us to do but that we just cannot do. Morality is fundamentally tragic. That parent in the drawing is trying to protect her kids, but there are some harms from which you simply cannot protect your kids. Yet you still have to. The purpose of this book is not to explain away these troubling binds, but rather to embrace them, in a kind of clear-eyed moral pessimism. If Tessman is right, life is marked by "unavoidable moral failures from which there can be no recovery and in which there is no redeeming value" (p. 3).

If that sounds dark, well, this is a dark book. At the same time, Tessman traces many impossible moral demands to our loving relationships and our "sacred values". It is only by taking these attachments very seriously that we can arrive at the notion of impossible demands. So while this may be a dark book, it is not a cynical one. Optimists and pessimists alike will find something of value here, as will anyone with an interest in moral dilemmas, demandingness, the "ought implies can" principle, supererogation, nonideal theory, care ethics, and moral phenomenology. In the end, while the members of my reading group -- "Failure Group", as I called it -- were not converted to Tessman's highly demanding view, we found vacationing in her moral dystopia to be time well spent.[1]

Chapter 1 introduces the book's central concepts: "impossible moral requirement", which is Tessman's adaptation of Michael Stocker's "impossible ought", and "unavoidable moral failure", which she loosely bases on Christopher Gowans' idea of "inescapable moral wrongdoing" (14). Impossible moral requirements pop up in moral dilemmas, among other places; since they are both required and impossible, they lead to unavoidable moral failure. Tessman defines a moral dilemma as

a situation of conflict in which there is a moral requirement to do A and a moral requirement to do B, where one cannot do both A and B, and where neither moral requirement ceases to be a moral requirement just because it conflicts with another moral requirement, even if for the purpose of action-guidance it is overridden. (15)

Two things are worth noting here. First, Tessman uses the term "requirement" broadly, "to refer to a plurality of kinds of (required) moral values", including responsibilities and actions that are "called for" (14). In this broad usage, she means to set herself apart from those who are interested only in duty or obligation. (Her usage I find somewhat confusing, because "required" to me connotes something quite a bit stronger than "called for", and her argument seems to depend on the strong reading. It's also not clear to me what it means for a value, rather than an action, to be required.) Second, Tessman shows that impossible moral requirements and the ensuing unavoidable moral failure are phenomena you should care about whether you take a "pro-dilemma" or "anti-dilemma" stance. If you are pro-dilemma, then you will accept that an agent sometimes has two genuinely conflicting requirements and that it is impossible to fulfill both. Importantly, moral failure is not a matter of blameworthiness, so in accepting that failure is unavoidable, you need not accept that agents are to blame for what they do (or don't do) in genuine dilemmas.

If you are anti-dilemma in the sense that you think all or most apparent dilemmas can actually be resolved for the purpose of action-guidance (for example, by choosing the option that ranks higher in a cost-benefit analysis), you should still care about moral failure because  on Tessman's view, moral failure is not about action-guidance. In other words, you can fail morally even if an action-guiding decision procedure "resolves" your moral conflict. Things are more difficult if you are anti-dilemma on the grounds that you think the very notion of a moral dilemma contradicts the principle of "ought implies can" (this Tessman calls the "deontological denial of moral dilemmas" (18)). But, as will be central to the book, she does not believe that ought implies can. Whether you are willing to call them "dilemmas" or not, she wants you to consider cases where values are in such dire conflict that whatever you choose, you leave what Bernard Williams famously called a "remainder" (29).

Not all moral conflicts result in moral failure. Tessman is only interested in hard cases, where "non-negotiable" moral requirements conflict with each other. A requirement is non-negotiable if it trades on a unique, non-substitutable value and if the cost of violating it is "a cost that no one should have to bear" (44). Tessman borrows Martha Nussbaum's idea of "capabilities" to set the threshold of bearable costs: if an action pushes persons below an acceptable level on the ten capabilities that are central to human dignity, then it involves serious moral wrongdoing and the situation is "tragic". Non-negotiable moral requirements are not, according to Tessman, constrained by ought implies can. So there is a moral requirement, for example, that political leaders ensure that citizens meet the threshold of capabilities, even if limited resources make this impossible.

In what is I think a very important but under-emphasized point, Tessman observes that what counts as non-negotiably required might be plastic in problematic ways. She considers a conflict between two candidate non-negotiable values: basic health care for all, and extending life using available expensive technology. (Let's suppose that we are extending not just quantity, but quality of life, and only for those who really desire it.) If this is a real case of impossible moral requirements and unavoidable moral failure, then choosing one value -- say, choosing to fund basic healthcare, thereby leaving no funds leftover for expensive life-sustaining treatments -- would be morally tragic. But Tessman points out that, once the expensive treatment becomes impossible (because we simply have no money left for it), we might be less inclined to believe such treatment is really required -- maybe this wasn't a tragic conflict after all (47-48). Here she reveals not only the difficulty of determining which values are non-negotiable, but also the nagging appeal of the ought implies can principle.

I think there will also be cases where reflecting on what we value alters what we deem impossible. The phenomenological experience of moral failure -- of having not fulfilled an impossible requirement -- might sometimes in fact be an experience of doubt about whether some requirement was really impossible. A parent who is not a physician but still feels like she failed in not curing her child's incurable cancer is not necessarily violating ought implies can; perhaps she is wondering whether one more late night of online research could have led her to a breakthrough clinical trial. And perhaps it could have. It's not always clear which actions are impossible.

The central challenge Tessman faces is to get from a claim about moral phenomenology to a normative claim about the demands of morality. The phenomenological claim is a descriptive one: people sometimes feel a sense of "I must" (a phrase borrowed from Nel Noddings) conjoined with "I can't". One source of this feeling is loving relationships, and here Tessman draws on Harry Frankfurt's notion of "volitional necessity" to explain how the value of a beloved person generates reasons for action. "One who loves in this way," she claims, "experiences the value of the beloved . . . as compelling, or as generating the necessity, the requirement, of certain actions, such as actions that protect, preserve, care for, nurture, or repair the beloved" (51). Love also makes certain actions "unthinkable", thus generating dilemmatic moral conflicts. For example, it is unthinkable for a parent to send her child off into mortal danger; doing so would be "non-negotiably prohibited", even when honoring this prohibition is impossible (51). Simply to consider the unthinkable action is, all by itself, to transgress the value generated by the loving relationship (53).

In a dilemmatic situation like "Sophie's Choice", where a mother must choose whether her son or daughter is to die, all options are unthinkable -- choosing the son, choosing the daughter, or allowing both to be sent. Moral failure is inevitable. The same is true of the "Crying Baby" dilemma, in which a parent must decide whether to smother a crying baby in order to save a whole group of people, the baby included, who will otherwise be killed. Tessman discusses these fictional cases, as well as equally horrific real-life cases from contexts of war and atrocity. The question is what to think about such cases, and whether it is common to experience moral failure in less dramatic contexts, or in any non-caregiving context for that matter.

Tessman wants to tell a vindicating story, rather than a debunking one, about experiences of impossible demands and moral failure. In other words, she seeks to show that those impossible actions really were required and that you really did fail -- not in the sense of being to blame, but at least in the sense of having done wrong. In Chapter 2, she looks to recent work in empirical moral psychology to support her vindicating story. Rather than dismiss people's experience of moral failure as irrational or misguided, Tessman claims that our intuitive moral judgments are largely arational. This chapter contains an overview of the "dual process" model of moral judgment and meticulously annotated discussions of the work of Daniel Kahneman, Joshua Greene, Jonathan Haidt, Jesse Prinz, Tamar Gendler, Philip Tetlock, and many others. Readers unfamiliar with this literature will find it a helpful introduction; readers familiar with and interested in these debates will probably find it overly ambitious.

Suppose that we accepted every piece of Tessman's carefully assembled empirical story: that the dual process and social intuitionist models are roughly correct; that experiences of impossible demands are a moral case of Gendler's "alief"; that they involve Greene's "alarm bell" emotions; that moral judgments are what Prinz calls "prescriptive sentiments" or "oughtitudes"; that non-negotiable requirements trade on what Tetlock and colleagues call "sacred values"; etc. Even granting all these pieces (breezily oversimplified here), which most members of my reading group were not willing to do, we were still not sure that the puzzle completely fits together. It felt in the end like we simply had a lot more cool vocabulary for describing the purported data -- that people have experiences of impossible requirements and moral failure -- but no more reason to think that these experiences ought to be trusted as guides to what the demands of morality really are. It is one thing to say that the feeling of "I must" is a moral "alief" that does not abide by ought implies can; it is another to say that ought, especially in the sense of "required", does not really imply can.

Tessman would want to put "really" in scare quotes, and indeed she does in Chapter 3, in which she makes explicit the antirealist, broadly constructivist metaethical view that imbues our first-personal experiences of moral requirement with some degree of "moral authority" (99). She does think we can be morally mistaken. But we cannot use Rawlsian reflective equilibrium, or even Margaret Urban Walker's feminist version of it, to test all of our intuitive moral judgments for correctness, because to do so would be to transgress the "sacred values" on which some of those judgments depend. Sacred values are such that you cannot be both committed to them and willing to question them -- otherwise they wouldn't be sacred (120-121). In the end, Tessman thinks we might be able to test some of our sacred values if we combine Walker's idea of "transparency testing" with Haidt's "social intuitionist" model and allow the social community, but not the individual agent, to scrutinize a particular sacred value. I found this solution unsatisfying, but cannot here do justice to the rich arguments of this chapter. In the end, readers will have to decide if Tessman's very modest promise for the chapter -- "Confidence is all that can back the moral authority of any requirement, so it is all that I can offer" (102) -- is enough.

The long Chapters 1, 2, and 3 constitute Part I, the theoretical heart of the book. If the reader has not been convinced of Tessman's basic framework, then the remaining short chapters (Parts II and III) will not likely seal the deal. Nonetheless, I found these later chapters the most interesting part of the book. Chapter 4 presents cases of unavoidable moral failure from the Holocaust. Tessman argues that we should resist triumphalist narratives that portray survivors and rescuers as moral heroes, instead recognizing that moral goodness was often impossible. This brief chapter felt like it only scratched the surface of this well-trodden topic, and not all of her interpretations of the cases were convincing. I hope Tessman publishes more on this, as she has a keen eye for uncovering complexity where others see moral clarity.

Chapter 5 criticizes "nonideal" theory for not being nonideal enough. The nonideal theorists, Tessman claims, are doing something right: they want to take the experiences of the oppressed seriously, and find solutions to unjust structures. Where they fall short, she says, is in failing to recognize that there are "irrectifiable wrongs, irreparable damage, and uncompensatable losses" (195). Ironically, the nonideal theorists' pragmatic focus on action-guidance is, she charges, itself a kind of illicit idealization. Some problems cannot be fixed; some actions cannot be guided. Here I worry that Tessman is not fair to the nonideal theorists, and that she overcorrects. If we follow her advice, our pessimism will lead us so far from action-guidance that (at least in some contexts) we no longer take possibility to be a constraint on our moral prescriptions. This feels too close to resignation.

In Chapters 6 and 7, Tessman situates her view within the debate over supererogation and the demandingness of morality. By making some actions optional, "supererogationists" let agents off the hook too easily, she claims. Instead, morality is extremely (impossibly!) demanding, but not in an agent-neutral, impartial way as folks like Peter Singer and Peter Unger have argued. Its demands issue rather from relations we bear to particular, vulnerable others, a view inspired by Eva Kittay and Robert Goodin. These two chapters are worth careful study -- this book rewards stamina. I am very sympathetic to Tessman's view that caring relationships can be extraordinarily demanding, and that we can end up in these relationships due merely to luck. At the same time, I think an obligation-supererogation framework with an "ought implies can" constraint has more to offer than Tessman allows. For one thing, admitting that there is a threshold beyond which actions are supererogatory and therefore not required is not to make any claims about where that threshold is -- the bar may still be set very, very high. (It may also be a moving bar.[2]) Whereas Tessman prefers to say that there is no conflict in calling the impossible "required", my own view is that we should pay closer attention to what acts are and are not possible, and adjust our requirements accordingly. Maybe a lot more is possible, and a lot more is required. But let's not abandon the idea that a "requirement" is a tool meant for action-guiding, something we can really hold you to.

In the end, while I was not convinced that moral life is filled with inexhaustible, impossible moral requirements, I learned an enormous amount from this book. It is a curious book, at once progressive and regressive. It is progressive in its fidelity to the first-personal experience of real agents and its attention to empirical social science. It is regressive in its embrace of "sacred" values and its resistance to intellectual processes that might reveal sacredness to be a sham. It also articulates a view that is at once extremely demanding and not demanding at all: extremely demanding because even the impossible can be required, and not demanding at all because impossible actions will not, by definition, ever be realized, so you don't really have to do them, only to feel awful about not doing them. While I am not sure where that leaves us, I do agree that "moral failure" is all around us -- if not the failure to live up to impossible requirements, then at least the failure to live up to the possible ones.

[1] I am grateful to Larry Jost, Curt Sheldon, Leigh Jackson, Kyle Furlane, Walter Stepanenko, and Sarah Carr for participating in a reading group whose discussions greatly informed this review.

[2] I argue for this view in "The Ratcheting-Up Effect" Pacific Philosophical Quarterly 93 (2012): 228-254.