Moral Fictionalism

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Mark Eli Kalderon, Moral Fictionalism, Oxford University Press, 2005, 208pp, $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199275971.

Reviewed by Stephen Finlay, University of Southern California


Do we really believe the moral claims we make, or are we just pretending? In likely the most provocative metaethical book of 2005, Mark Eli Kalderon argues for ‘hermeneutical’ moral fictionalism: our ordinary practice of moral judgement involves a form of make-believe rather than genuine belief. Although fictionalist approaches to morality are currently in vogue, this proposal is radically different from other recent versions, which maintain that our moral judgements involve systematically false beliefs and counsel that we do best to continue practicing moral judgement, but now as a convenient fiction (Joyce, The Myth of Morality 2001, Nolan, Restall & West, “Moral Fictionalism vs. the Rest” 2005). Kalderon’s book therefore has the rare distinction of advancing a genuinely new kind of view in a crowded field. It is an important original contribution that should be read by all scholars and advanced students of metaethics, and will be of interest to those engaged in parallel debates in other areas of philosophy.

As Kalderon surveys the current metaethical landscape, he perceives a dilemma. We are forced to choose between (on one hand) a plausible view of the content of moral judgements as representational, saddled with an implausible view of the attitudes involved in moral judgements as beliefs, and (on the other) a plausible view of moral attitudes as “affects” of some kind, saddled with an implausible view of moral content as nonrepresentational. His solution is that moral judgements involve an affective attitude of make-believe towards a representational content.

To establish that moral judgements primarily involve attitudes other than belief, Kalderon offers a novel and ingenious argument (from Moral Intransigence). Eschewing the well-traveled strategy of appealing to the motivational properties possessed by moral attitudes but lacked by beliefs, he instead attempts to locate an epistemic property of beliefs lacked by moral attitudes. Close attention to fundamental disagreement between reasonable epistemic peers, he claims, reveals that beliefs and moral judgements are not governed by the same norms. (1) If acceptance of a claim is both (i) an instance of belief, and (ii) made “on behalf of others” or in public inquiry, then it is governed by a norm of noncomplacency: in a context of disagreement with an epistemic peer about the existence of reasons to accept or reject the claim, we have some obligation to subject the claim to further critical scrutiny. Your disagreement with me despite possessing the same evidence gives me reason to reconsider my belief. (2) Because of the authority of morality, moral acceptance is always on behalf of others. (3) However, moral acceptance is not noncomplacent: when confronted with a fundamental moral disagreement with our epistemic peers, we have no obligation to scrutinize our moral views further. It follows that the attitude of moral acceptance cannot be belief.

Acceptance on behalf of others involves regarding others to have “no need … to inquire further — [they] may simply take [one’s] word for it” (23), and this is surely why it is governed by noncomplacency, unlike acceptance merely for oneself. Kalderon cites four different features of morality’s authority as grounds for moral acceptance being always on behalf of others: (a) precedence — moral reasons can override conflicting nonmoral reasons; (b) noncontingency — moral reasons are not contingent on anyone’s moral acceptances; © well-groundedness — the reasons that ground moral claims are reasons for acceptance for everybody; (d) “demand” - utterance of a moral sentence expresses a demand that the audience accept it. Unfortunately, it is not clear how any of these features supports the claim that moral acceptance is always on behalf of others. Features (a)© spell out a familiar view of the universality and categoricity of moral reasons, but do not entail that we must think that others should accept moral claims on our authority. Feature (d) seems to capture a generic truth about assertion per se. But surely we can accept moral sentences without asserting them or demanding that others accept them. There therefore seems to be room for legitimate doubt about Kalderon’s second premise. Indeed it is commonly thought that moral decisions should always be dictated by personal conscience, a supposition compatible with the universality and categoricity of moral reasons but incompatible with the premise.

Significant doubts can also be raised about the third premise. Arguably it is not uncommon that disagreement with some approximation to an epistemic peer causes us to feel pressure to scrutinize some moral commitment. (In the course of teaching moral and social issues, there is hardly a single controversial moral stance that I haven’t felt obligated to reconsider). Kalderon also accepts that any obligation here would be “lax”: further reflection would be epistemically virtuous but not required, and the reasons to reflect would be readily outweighed by other factors. Plausible outweighers are easily imagined in the moral case, e.g., showing any indication of a lack of conviction greatly weakens our powers of persuasion, the full exercise of which are vital in moral dispute. Kalderon’s case that moral judgements are not beliefs may be ingenious, but unfortunately it is not convincing.

The details of the positive view of moral attitudes emerge from the Argument from Aspect Shift. Looking now at intrapersonal moral conflict, we find that when people move between “distinct normative perspectives”, they experience a “normative aspect shift: … different features of [their] circumstance become salient and present a different normative appearance” (44). Moral attitudes, then, have a phenomenological character — they involve certain factors in a circumstance seeming to be reasons. Kalderon claims that the best explanation of this phenomenology is as a particular kind of affect: a desire in the directed attention sense (following Scanlon). To have a moral attitude is to structure your experience so that certain features are salient or appear to be reasons; it is “literally” to decide how you feel about the circumstance (50-1). This is a form of make-believe because it involves structuring our consciousness as if we really believed the moral sentence. (It is unclear what Kalderon would say about the amoralist, who accepts moral claims without motivation or recognition of reasons for action.)

This intriguing account raises many questions. Although billed as an argument to the “best” explanation, Kalderon does not discuss any other possible explanations to show them inferior. A number of features of the account seem more suited to construal as belief or perception. The “normative aspect shift” closely parallels the kind of gestalt shift familiar from the duck-rabbit and similar images. Does the fact that we can either see a drawing of a duck or drawing of a rabbit, depending on how we look at the figure, provide any support to a claim that we only make-believe that we see a drawing of a duck or of a rabbit? One wonders, too, how to square fictionalism with the characterization of this experience as phenomenological: in no familiar game of make-believe does some fictional element of the game present an actual appearance.

Having argued that moral judgements are not beliefs, Kalderon turns (in chapter 2) to eliminate fictionalism’s “noncognitivist” rival, expressivism. His critique is a tour de force, as good a critical treatment of expressivism as one can find. Primitive forms of expressivism commit the pragmatic fallacy; as forms of semantic behaviourism they conflate an account of the use of moral sentences with an account of their content. As is widely acknowledged, this presents the primitive expressivist with an irresolvable dilemma: either (a) simple moral sentences have the same content whether embedded or free-standing - in which case, contra expressivism, their content cannot consist in the expression of pro or con-attitudes — or else (b) the content of simple moral sentences differs according to their occurrence as embedded or free-standing — which, among other costs, renders apparently valid moral arguments invalid. Kalderon then examines whether sophisticated expressivism can do better, focusing on the work of Allan Gibbard 2003, whose recent book is intimidating in its technical sophistication. Kalderon is uncowed, arguing persuasively that Gibbard ultimately faces just such a dilemma of his own. Substituting a functional-role semantics for the primitive expressivists’ semantic behaviourism, Gibbard offers a formalism in which moral terms have a common content across embedded and free-standing occurrences. But does the resultant formalism genuinely represent expressivist contents rather than representational contents? Kalderon argues that neither Gibbard’s argument nor any clear alternative successfully establishes an expressivist result. If functional role determines semantic content, then for all we know that content is representational; if it rather characterizes what speakers do in uttering moral sentences, then it is an account of moral pragmatics rather than semantics. (Kalderon’s conclusion that expressivism is therefore “implausible” seems a nonsequitur, however).

A quarter of the book (chapter 3) is devoted to the taxonomy of the available positions in the moral realism debate, in order to show that “noncognitivist factualism” is a significant, overlooked option in the theoretical space. While Kalderon’s treatment is presented as clarificatory, it rather seems radically revisionary, and to threaten considerable mischief in a field already plagued by unfortunate and contested classificatory schemes. “Noncognitivism”, he suggests, properly names a view about the kind of attitude involved in moral judgement (viz., that they are not beliefs), rather than a view about the kind of content that moral judgements have. The observation that having representational content does not entail that a judgement is a belief is well taken. But “noncognitivism” has been widely used to name a view about the contents expressed by moral judgements (viz., nonrepresentational contents). Perhaps the point is that “noncognitivism” is a more appropriate label defined as Kalderon suggests. But his own proposals are less than transparent: the term “nonfactualism” is adopted for the expressivist view that moral judgements have nonrepresentational content, with the oxymoronic consequence that fictionalism is a form of factualism.

More systematically confusing is the attempt to situate fictionalism in the moral realism debate as an overlooked alternative position to moral realism, error theory, and expressivism. According to Kalderon, the moral realism debate is not genuinely concerned with the metaphysical issue of whether there are moral facts, but rather with the semantic issue of the nature and use of moral sentences, and with the epistemic issue of our warrant in accepting them. The moral realist, therefore, holds that (i) moral sentences express moral propositions, (ii) acceptance of these sentences is constituted by belief in those propositions, and (iii) we are justified in at least some of these beliefs: “The fundamental question for realism is whether we are justified in believing the moral propositions expressed by the sentences we accept” (144). The expressivist denies (i), the error theorist denies (iii), while the fictionalist denies (ii). This taxonomy leads to the following counterintuitive results: moral realists need not hold that there are any moral facts or truths, since it is enough that people are justified in believing that there are; error theorists can accept the existence of moral facts and properties — they just deny either that they are the ones that our moral judgements describe, or that we are justified in believing those (true) judgements (we need to allow for this, Kalderon argues, to make room for the metaethical equivalent of the theological agnostic. But the error theorist seems rather the analog of the atheist); moral realists cannot hold that there are moral facts all of which are unknowable for us; error theorists cannot hold that while there are no moral facts and therefore our moral judgements are systematically false, we are nonetheless justified in continuing to accept them.

Two other features of Kalderon’s view bear special mention. The first has to do with his treatment of our common-sense understanding of morality: he accepts that ordinarily competent speakers take their moral acceptances to be beliefs and do not recognize them as make-believe. His fictionalism therefore claims that we systematically misconceive the nature of our own moral practices. Kalderon’s observation that we are “not always fully transparent” to ourselves is quite in order, although in imputing such systematic error his fictionalism assumes a heavy burden of proof. But this view may be especially susceptible to a form of objection recently pressed against noncognitivism by Joshua Gert: if a generation engaged in moral discourse as a fiction, but never taught their children that it is a fiction, then would not their children (and we ourselves) have learned it as fact?

The second feature concerns the extent of the fictionalist proposal. Kalderon focuses on our ascriptions of moral properties such as wrongness. But is the account intended to extend to ascriptions of moral obligations, virtues, and reasons? To normative but nonmoral properties and reasons? The question is particularly pressing with regard to reasons since much of the positive view is framed in terms of them. Although the possibility of a “noncognitivist” account of reasons-talk is explicitly acknowledged, Kalderon is happy to allow that “while moral acceptance is not belief in a moral proposition, it is belief in a proposition that represents a kind of reason” (167) — even a moral reason. In fact, to accept a moral claim fictionally is, on the offered account, to accept (sometimes he even says “believe” (29)) that there are good reasons possessing the authority characteristic of morality, and involves such reasons presenting themselves phenomenologically. It seems to be particularly ascriptions of properties, like moral wrongness, that excite Kalderon’s irrealist scruples. A reader may wonder why we should not simply analyze moral wrongness in terms of moral reasons, as Scanlon does. However the Argument from Moral Intransigence seems as applicable to reasons as to wrongness, as Kalderon seems to allow that reasonable epistemic peers may disagree — fundamentally and complacently — about the reasons some circumstance presents.

It will be clear, then, that I do not find Kalderon’s fictionalist view, his arguments, or his taxonomic proposals persuasive. But I admire the book greatly nonetheless, for its bold originality and creativity, its attention to detail, and its clear argument. It will deservedly invigorate the metaethical debate for some time to come.