Moral Knowledge

Moral Knowledge Book Cover

Sarah McGrath, Moral Knowledge, Oxford University Press, 2019, 218pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198805410.

Reviewed by David Phillips, University of Houston


In the introduction to the book, Sarah McGrath explains her key aims. She has an overall working hypothesis:

moral knowledge can be acquired in any of the ways in which we acquire ordinary empirical knowledge, and our efforts to acquire and preserve such knowledge are subject to frustration in all of the same ways that our efforts to acquire and preserve ordinary empirical knowledge are. (2)

The book is not supposed to constitute a systematic defense of the working hypothesis. Rather, each of its four further substantive chapters -- on reflective equilibrium, moral knowledge from others, observation and experience, and losing moral knowledge -- is intended to be substantially independent. They together advance the case for the working hypothesis by focusing on places where it might seem vulnerable. In my judgment the book succeeds admirably in fulfilling these aims. It is engagingly written and ingeniously argued, and anyone interested in these issues will find much to ponder here.

As McGrath invites readers to do, I will focus on the chapters I was most intrigued by, on reflective equilibrium and on observation and experience. Before turning to them, though, I should note one other theme flagged in the introduction which runs through the book: the idea that moral knowledge "has an important social dimension" (5), and that this social dimension "has been at least somewhat underemphasized within moral epistemology". The idea seems to me a plausible one, and it gets deployed usefully in various forms throughout the book, as well as being the particular focus of chapter three.

Turn now to chapter two on reflective equilibrium. McGrath argues that reflective equilibrium has less importance than many philosophers have supposed. She distinguishes modest from ambitious interpretations of the method.

Those who accept an ambitious interpretation of the method and its epistemological role tend to see the justification we ultimately have for our moral views as in some way arising out of, or dependent upon, reflective equilibrium reasoning. (17)

She develops two main lines of criticism of the ambitious interpretation. Let me sketch them. One line of criticism is that engaging in the method of reflective equilibrium is not necessary for acquiring moral knowledge. Ordinary moral agents can know that slavery is wrong without having done the kind of systematic reflection that reflective equilibrium reasoning requires.

The view that whatever moral knowledge there is is knowledge that is arrived at via reflective equilibrium reasoning seems to predict that there is relatively little moral knowledge, and that what we have of it is disproportionately had by unusually reflective individuals. (22)

The other line of criticism is that engaging in the method is not sufficient for moral justification. If the considered judgments with which I begin a process of reflective equilibrium reasoning include

We are morally required to occasionally kill randomly

then the judgments with which I end up after engaging fully in a reflective equilibrium process may not be justified.

Many moral philosophers will feel the urge to push back against these provocative arguments. My own inclination is to try to do so by adapting one of McGrath's own themes: that knowledge is importantly social. I am convinced by McGrath's first line of criticism. Surely individuals can have moral knowledge without engaging in significant amounts of reflective equilibrium reasoning themselves: they can simply and properly draw on the moral knowledge of others. I am less convinced by the second line of criticism. It seems to me plausible that the best we can do in our collective moral deliberations is just what the reflective equilibrium theorist tells us we should do. We still might be wrong. The considered judgments with which we begin might be crucially in error. But that is something out of our control; if we begin properly with considered judgments, but our considered judgments are in error, that is bad luck that does not undermine our claim to justification. So regarded, reflective equilibrium does not set a standard we have to meet as individuals: individuals need not themselves engage in reflective equilibrium reasoning to have moral knowledge or moral justification. But reflective equilibrium is still in an important way the right description of moral methodology: it describes the standards a social process has to meet to generate justified moral views.

McGrath does consider a response to her second objection in the same ballpark as this one. But it strikes me as importantly different and less persuasive. What she considers is the possibility of interpersonal constraints on permissible starting points for individual reflective equilibrium reasoning. She objects that there are good reasons to reject such constraints. What I am tempted by, though, is not this but a more thoroughly social conception of justification in moral belief: In the light of McGrath's first objection, we should relocate reflective equilibrium from the individual to the social level, and hold that individuals' moral beliefs are justified to the extent that they are the product of a social process of reflective equilibrium reasoning.

The other chapter by which I was most intrigued is chapter four on observation and experience. It is the chapter in which one might expect McGrath's working hypothesis, that moral knowledge can be acquired in any of the ways in which we acquire ordinary empirical knowledge, to come under most pressure. She begins the chapter by rehearsing widely held views according to which observation and experience do not play the same role in moral as in non-moral thinking. She notes the strong tradition according to which moral knowledge is a priori. A bit later she sketches a view she calls "generic rationalism" according to which

The core or fundamental truths of morality are known (when they are known at all) a priori; empirical evidence comes into play only in the application of this core moral knowledge. (113)

One might expect McGrath to take a strong stand against generic rationalism. And one suspects that she has some inclination to do so (as evidenced, for instance, by footnotes referring approvingly to Nick Sturgeon). But the position she in fact defends in chapter four is strikingly nuanced. She does not argue against the view that the core truths of morality are knowable a priori. She argues only that they are knowable a posteriori too. As she explains the thesis of the chapter:

Experience and observation can contribute to moral knowledge in any of the ways in which they contribute to our ordinary, non-moral knowledge of the world around us. (108)

This nuanced position features a noteworthy asymmetry. Assuming that empirical claims are not knowable a priori, from the armchair, we have extra ways of knowing moral claims which we don't have of knowing empirical claims: all the ordinary experiential and observational ways plus the armchair way. This asymmetry seems (to me anyway) surprising. (It makes me want to ask whether something is missing on the other side: whether the conceptual scheme with which McGrath classifies ways of knowing misses some way of knowing empirical claims that is not a way of knowing moral claims. But I won't try to pursue that question here.)

McGrath distinguishes four ways in which observation and experience contribute to ordinary empirical knowledge. The most important is empirical confirmation and disconfirmation. Those who hold that empirical evidence is irrelevant to moral claims seem committed to the view that moral claims cannot be confirmed by empirical evidence. McGrath argues persuasively that they are mistaken. The easiest way to summarize her line of argument is to consider schematically described cases like this:

You believe initially that engaging in behavior B is seriously morally wrong. And you believe initially that person P is a morally upstanding person who would not regularly engage in behavior that is seriously morally wrong. Then you discover that person P regularly engages in B.

Given this schematic description of the case, there is no right answer as to how you should revise your beliefs. But, McGrath plausibly argues, one possibility as the details are filled in is the following: you should lower your credence in the belief that engaging in behavior B is seriously morally wrong. If so, what has happened is this. Empirical evidence -- that P regularly engages in B -- has led you, in conjunction with the auxiliary hypothesis that person P is a morally upstanding person who would not regularly engage in behavior that is seriously morally wrong, rationally to change your moral beliefs. It has disconfirmed the moral belief that engaging in behavior B is seriously morally wrong (and thus confirmed the moral belief that engaging in behavior B is not seriously morally wrong).

This line of argument strikes me as persuasive. The question is how far it undermines the standard view that empirical evidence is irrelevant to moral claims and the position of the generic moral rationalist. McGrath characterizes such cases as involving the "direct confirmation" of moral beliefs by empirical evidence. But this description depends on a perfectly reasonable but potentially misleading account of the distinction between direct and indirect confirmation. On McGrath's account,

When empirical evidence confirms a moral claim because it confirms some non-moral claim that either grounds or potentially grounds the moral claim, let's say the empirical evidence indirectly confirms the moral claim . . . Let's say the empirical evidence directly confirms a moral claim just in case it confirms that moral claim but not because it confirms the claim indirectly. (114, emphasis in original)

It is true that empirical evidence in the case we are considering counts in this sense as direct. But that is potentially misleading because, in another equally natural sense, the empirical evidence seems indirect: it bears on the moral claim only in virtue of the auxiliary hypothesis that connects them.

Still, McGrath argues convincingly that the idea that moral and empirical claims are independent is wrong if construed as a claim about confirmation. But philosophers attracted by generic rationalism might at this point rethink. They might say: even if the independence claim is false as a claim about confirmation, there is still an important truth in the area, which needs to be framed in some other way. One such way might draw on T.M. Scanlon's discussion of pure and mixed normative claims. As he argues, puzzlement about the supervenience of the normative on the non-normative can be dispelled by distinguishing pure normative claims from mixed normative claims. Pure normative claims neither make nor presuppose claims about natural facts. Mixed normative claims involve pure normative claims but also make or presuppose factual claims.

Mixed normative facts depend on non-normative facts, and which non-normative facts they depend on is a normative matter, determined by the truth of pure normative claims. The truth of pure normative claims, by contrast, does not depend on, or co-vary with, non-normative facts. (Scanlon 2014, 40-41)

I take it that nothing Scanlon says here is incompatible with McGrath's claims about confirmation. So one possible lesson is that that the independence of the normative -- like the independence of the mathematical -- is better understood as a claim about metaphysics than as a claim about confirmation.

As noted above, McGrath's opposition to generic rationalism is strikingly cautious and nuanced. Indeed, she spends most of the final section of the chapter on observation and experience working to generate the best account of armchair moral knowledge: one according to which armchair knowledge involves propositions which seem true because (non-deviantly) they are true. Having developed this account, she considers a possible line of objection: that it is less plausible that there is knowledge of this kind in the moral than in the mathematical case:

The proposition slavery is unjust seems like a natural candidate for being a self-evident proposition in the moral domain as 1+1=2 is in the mathematical domain. However, although the proposition that slavery is unjust now seems obviously true to many people, there is significant historical evidence that this is a relatively recent phenomenon, and that in fact, the same proposition would have seemed obviously false to countless human beings who thoroughly understood it . . . By contrast, it is unlikely that the proposition 1+1=2 ever seemed false to any significant number of people who perfectly understood it. (149, emphasis in original)

While I don't deny that the moral cases are less clear than the mathematical ones, I think the kind of example McGrath gives is not the best kind of example of an apparently self-evident moral claim. Rather, I think, one lesson from the intuitionist tradition is that the best candidates to be self-evident moral claims are, as Ross argued, claims about prima facie duty or moral reasons, claims like:

That an action would be the breaking of a promise is a reason not to do it.

That an action would cause pain is a reason not to do it.

It would be harder to argue that these claims seemed obviously false to countless human beings till relatively recently than it is to make that argument about the claim that slavery is unjust or other claims about what Ross called "duty proper".

These issues could be pursued considerably further, much further than I have space for here. And the same is true of the issues discussed in chapters three and five. Anyone interested in these matters will benefit from and enjoy reading and engaging with McGrath's book.


Many thanks to Sarah McGrath and Luis Oliveira for very helpful comments.


Scanlon, T.M., 2014. Being Realistic About Reasons. Oxford: Oxford University Press.