Moral Literacy

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Barbara Herman, Moral Literacy, Harvard University Press, 2007, 342pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780674024670.

Reviewed by Adrienne Martin, University of Pennsylvania


Moral Literacy collects thirteen of Barbara Herman's essays in Kantian ethics.  Four are previously unpublished, and eight of the nine previously published works appeared in hard-to-find volumes, and have been revised.  These essays map wide territory, and it is important territory for Kantians and non-Kantians alike to explore.  Of particular interest, and my focus in this commentary, is that Herman develops a Kantian virtue theory, which emerges gradually from the set of essays on a range of topics.  I have tried to draw together this theory and raise some questions about it, rather than discuss each chapter separately.  I do, however, provide a very brief capsule summary of each chapter at the end of the commentary.

I. The Spirit of Herman's Work

Generally speaking, Herman hews more closely to Kant than many of her contemporaries.  Her willingness to embrace Kant's hedonism regarding nonmoral motives, anti-constructivist interpretation of the Kingdom of Ends, relatively moralistic take on the "latitude" within the duty of beneficence, and insistence that the Formula of Universal Law takes deliberative priority over other formulations of the Categorical Imperative all make her significantly less revisionist than, for example, Thomas Hill or Christine Korsgaard (who are revisionist in very different ways).  It also seems to me that, pace Stephen Darwall's blurb on the back of the book, Herman is more deeply committed to "orthodox" Kantian dualisms between reason and desire, morality and happiness, and rational principle and particular judgment than are other Kantians writing today.  Nevertheless, wherever she endorses a conceptual divide, Herman builds an empirical bridge, using the materials provided by our social embeddedness and agency vulnerability, and the obligations they imply for social institutions.  The result is a picture of moral agency that is extremely Kantian and yet unified in a way that Kant himself never manages -- indeed, never seems particularly concerned -- to depict.

Focusing specifically on Herman's virtue theory, it is deeply Kantian in two important ways.  First, it relies on a conception of virtue as a feature of rational deliberation.  This conception is in sharp contrast with the more familiar conception drawn from Aristotelian virtue theory, where the individual's flourishing is the ultimate good, and certain character traits or dispositions -- "the Virtues" -- are instrumental to and constitutive of flourishing.  That is, virtue is essentially a feature of emotional and behavioral dispositions.  Responding to critiques from the likes of Elizabeth Anscombe, Phillipa Foot, Alisdair MacIntyre, and Michael Stocker,[1] a number of Kantians have attempted to find support in Kant's ethics for attributing moral significance to such dispositions.[2]  Herman is refreshingly (and, I think, rightly) blunt about the limits on the rapprochement attainable between Kantian and Aristotelian ethics.  The latter is heteronomous -- i.e. it is based on hypothetical imperatives (If you would achieve flourishing, act thusly) -- and there is no way around that, or the fact that heteronomous moral theory is Kant's greatest nemesis.  Thus, instead of towing Kant toward Athens, Herman develops a theory according to which virtue is, at base, a matter of self-governance according to rational principles.

The second way that Herman's virtue theory is Kantian is that it is based on Kantian metaphysics of the rational will, according to which the will is a causal power constituted by the moral law.  This is the sticky stuff of Groundwork III and, as Herman remarks, things would go much easier for Kant if he could do without it.  She knows she is swimming upstream, but is convinced that a genuinely Kantian theory of virtuous rational deliberation cannot be skimmed off Kantian metaphysics.  This is, unsurprisingly, the most resistible aspect of Herman's theory, as I discuss in section VI.

II. Character & the Deliberative Field

It's helpful first to locate Herman's account of character in relation to her account of deliberation and action.  In Chapter 1, "Making Room for Character," she contrasts her account with the typical Humean one.  The Humean focuses on a desire to be satisfied and a belief about how to satisfy it.  Deliberation thus naturally appears to be a question of choice among which desire(s) to satisfy and which means to take.  Herman directs our attention to a conceptually and developmentally prior stage, where certain desires are excluded from consideration altogether or, more commonly, included in deliberation only in modified form.  For example, the fact that I crave a chicken tamale does not feature in my deliberation about what to prepare for dinner tonight -- except perhaps as a desire for a vegetarian Mexican food with a chicken-like texture.  My commitment to a vegetarian diet shapes my "deliberative field."

In Chapter 10, "The Will and Its Objects," Herman limits the term "desire" to a representation that is a possible object of choice -- that is, a representation that has been admitted to the deliberative field.  Under this new vocabulary, my craving for a chicken tamale is, delightfully, mere "concupiscence", an "intense orientation toward pleasure" that the faculty of desire may or may not take up and endorse.  If my reading of Chapter 10 is correct, the faculty of desire is what shapes the deliberative field.  It's not until the representation of a chicken tamale as pleasurable has received endorsement -- is judged good according to the standards to which I am committed -- that it becomes a potential motive.  When I was not a vegetarian, this representation received endorsement pretty much automatically: the chicken tamale was always on the menu, so to speak.  Now, it is admitted to my deliberative field only after it is modified to conform to the practical principles to which I am committed.

Herman takes the concept of a deliberative field from her earlier work, and here connects it to character.  A person's character is, for Herman, defined by the shape of her deliberative field; and one has a morally good character insofar as the moral law "belongs to the framework within which desires and interests develop and gain access to the deliberative field" (23).  In Classical virtue theory, a person's character constitutes dispositions of emotion and behavior.  For Herman, by contrast, character is in a sense deeper: it has to do with one's evaluative commitments and how they shape one's motivational resources.

III. Virtuous Character as Moral Literacy

Herman also wants us to think about character in terms of "moral literacy" and how this idea connects with her concept of a deliberative field is not obvious.  She writes most directly and fully on moral literacy in Chapters 4 and 5, which were originally Tanner lectures.  Literacy, moral and other, is a matter of some knowledge-that, and a great deal of know-how.  It is a "capacity for knowing and doing, involving the symbolic manipulation of information as the condition for expressive action" (81).  To discover the connection between this capacity or set of skills and Herman's account of deliberation and choice, we have to look to what she says about the developmental history of moral character.

Literacy in a written language begins with the acquisition of certain basic abilities.  For example, one respected view in reading research is that the ability to read relies on the ability to break heard words into their phonemic parts, or "phonemic awareness."[3]  Analogously, Herman asserts that moral literacy "begins with the primitive and necessary acknowledgement of the difference between persons and things and the practically effective understanding of what it means for moral claims to be attached to persons" (97).  Once in possession of this basic skill, the agent can develop greater literacy, with others' assistance and support and, to some degree, on her own.  Furthermore, possession of this basic skill imposes an obligation both to employ it and to develop one's ability to employ it well, or at least well enough.  The practical awareness of the moral difference between persons and things is a pretty sophisticated, and markedly Kantian, skill to place at the foundation of moral literacy, as Herman acknowledges and briefly defends in a footnote (97n29).  It's therefore not exactly a revelation when Herman concludes, at the end of Chapter 5, that there is a "natural fit between Kantian values of rational agency and the idea of moral literacy" (129).

I take it, then, that we might see this minimal moral capacity as the acquisition of a set of concepts and the ability to both apply them to the objects of experience and then respond to those objects thus conceptualized.  What this means is that we acquire new tools for deliberation.  A creature that lacks minimal moral capacity has a deliberative field bereft of the distinction between persons and things.  More, understanding the concept of a person arguably involves committing to basic moral principles of behavior -- lines not to be crossed (do not treat a person like a thing), choices dictated (save the person before the thing), and so on.  The acquisition of this concept and the ability to employ it thus shapes the deliberative field in such a way that it becomes plausible to attribute to the concept-user a moral character.  The more skilled one is at employing this concept, and the more related concepts one masters, the more virtuous one's character becomes.  Chapter 6, "Training to Autonomy," outlines a Kantian theory of moral education that places the responsibility for teaching these skills largely in the hands of cultural and social institutions.

IV. The Seamlessness of Everyday Morality

Throughout the book, Herman refers to what, in Ch. 9, "The Scope of Moral Requirement," she calls the "seamlessness" of everyday morality: "an absence of conflict between morality and interest"(206).  A sufficiently morally literate agent navigates her daily life with confidence that she and others will choose rightly, without a need to battle (many) conflicting desires or goals.  This agent's deliberative framework is shaped by a commitment to the Categorical Imperative, so that few if any conflicting inclinations make it into her deliberative field; she receives further assurance that she will choose rightly, and that others will not take unfair or harmful advantage of her choices, from social institutions that provide safe space for the free exercise of deliberative capacities and discourage activities that infringe on or harm others' ability to freely exercise their own deliberative capacities.   (See especially Chapters 5 and 6 on the latter idea.)  "Seamless" describes the experience of the virtuous agent, the agent with good moral character.  Morality and the moral motive do not feel like the dictates of a shoulder-sitting angel.  They are, rather, built into and "dispersed" (22) throughout the agent's motivational system.

Herman does not say how closely any actual person approximates the virtuous agent, or how closely any actual social arrangement approximates those needed to provide the virtuous agent with a seamless experience of morality.  Occasional remarks about how such an agent would think about, e.g., property -- as an entrustment rather than as an entitlement -- suggest not very closely.  However, Herman also uses household and historical examples -- how a parent thinks about PTA funds, how feminist analyses make it possible to evaluate pornography under categories of injury previously unavailable -- that make it easy to see individual and social virtue as contiguous with actual agents and arrangements.

V. New Moral Facts and Improvisational Skill

Herman's is not the only theory of moral character that makes sense of why seamlessness would be a prominent feature of the virtuous agent's everyday life.  A person in possession of the Aristotelian virtues is by definition disposed to think and act rightly (or, more precisely, the right thoughts and actions are by definition those of the virtuous person).  Such a person would presumably experience morality as woven into the fabric of her life.  However, Aristotelian virtue theory has a harder time showing us either what is the right action when we are faced with morally unexpected or new circumstances, or why someone in possession of the Classical virtues -- stable dispositions of emotion and behavior -- would be better at dealing with these circumstances.  In contrast, in Herman's theory, the very same skills that make for a seamless experience of everyday morality are supposed to make the virtuous agent better at responding to "new moral facts."

Human history is rife with moments where people discover or create new moral facts.  Some moral facts are only epistemically new; feminist analyses of pornography make visible and describable harms that were already there -- these analyses allow us to see and understand moral facts, but do not create them.  Other moral facts are ontologically new; and some ontologically new facts arise from a changing environment, while others are our own creations.  Herman's final chapter, "Contingency in Obligation," argues that, first, Nelson Mandela's refusal to seek retribution for the wrongs he suffered in apartheid South Africa and, second, the establishment of the South African Truth and Reconciliation Commission (TRC) created brand new (i.e. not formerly latent) obligations for both the former victims and the former perpetrators of apartheid injustice.  Herman argues that a good theory of moral character should show why someone of virtuous character would be good at perceiving and responding to epistemically new moral facts as well as skilled at the improvisation of ontologically new moral facts.

Recall that the acquisition of minimal moral capacity not only sets one on the path to moral literacy, it also brings with it an obligation to employ and develop this capacity.  Part of this obligation, Herman argues, is to self-knowledge and self-reform.  A person with virtuous character pays attention to the shape of her deliberative field and stays alert to the possibility that it may need to be adjusted in the light of new moral facts; and moral education should support these skills, as well:  "The processes are interdependent: the content of known morality is reflected in our moral training; moral training includes abilities for self-shaping; these abilities make us responsible for creating and sustaining our moral character in the face of new knowledge; and so we must become trainers of ourselves" (308).

Thus we can begin to see how Kantian moral virtue lends itself to both a seamlessness in everyday experience and a preparedness to respond well to new moral facts, whether epistemically or ontologically.  But what of improvisational skill?  Why should a morally literate person, a person whose deliberative field is shaped by an understanding of the moral difference between persons and things, and by a commitment to the Categorical Imperative, be particularly creative?

Herman does not address this question directly -- her analysis of the TRC is focused on establishing that it was a genuine case of improvisation, that it actually created brand new moral facts.  At the end of the book, however, she remarks, "Fundamental moral values and principles have greater potential for organizing our affairs than can be realized or even appreciated at any given time.  It is this potential that is tapped for new procedures of justification when contingencies might seem to outstrip moral argument" (331).  The fundamental moral value tapped in the case of the TRC is equal moral status for all persons, which is the foundation for justifying legal retribution -- i.e. retribution is a way of restoring the harm done to the victim's moral or social status.  South Africa, in transitioning from apartheid to a democratic system of government was, practically speaking, unable to use a retributive system to establish equal moral status for the victims of apartheid.  Instead, the TRC created a public moral history as a basis for acknowledging this status.

We might extrapolate from this analysis that moral education can inculcate at least some degree of improvisational skill in the virtuous agent (leaving open the interesting possibility of improvisational genius).  Deep intellectual, affective, and motivational understanding of the fundamental moral principles that should and in fact do shape one's deliberative field, along with practice extending them to new circumstances, could do so.

VI. Kantian Metaphysics

In Chapters 7, 8, 10, and 11 we find arguments to the effect that Herman's theory of moral character, along with its advantage of simultaneously accounting for a seamless everyday experience, responsiveness to new moral facts, and improvisational skill, must be founded on Kantian metaphysics.  More specifically, it must be founded on Kant's theory of the will as self-motivating via the moral law.  The arguments are familiar in tone, if not minutiae: they aim to show that, when we choose how to act, we represent ourselves in a way that cannot be justified unless it is true that our wills are constituted by -- and therefore beholden to -- the moral law.  That is, a commitment to the moral law is implicit in the nature of deliberation and choice.

Kantians who want to argue this way rely on an implausibly moralized picture of deliberation and choice -- this is the only way choice implies a commitment to the moral law.  Allen Wood in Kant's Ethical Thought, for example, argues that choice of action implicitly attributes "objective" or "agent-neutral" value to the action's end.[4]  Similarly, Christine Korsgaard, in a number of essays and in Sources of Normativity, argues that end-setting involves representing the end as objectively justified.[5]

By Chapter 11, Herman has made a number of claims that add up to an even more deeply moralized picture of deliberation and choice.  She argues that the crucial feature of human versus animal wills is that we act for reasons and represent ourselves as acting for reasons (242-6).  This is part of what it is to operate with a deliberative field -- considerations admitted to the field are represented as possible reasons for action.  She also argues that, without a source of objective value -- i.e. value that bears an internal connection to the valuable object, and not just to the agent's desiderative states -- there can be no reasons for action (191, 243).  The need for a source of objective value is elusive, until she notes that it is in truth misleading to present Kant's view in terms of "reasons" for action: "We speak of good reasons and bad ones, pro tanto reasons and reasons all things considered.  A person who wants to cause another pain has a reason to hit him.  On Kant's account, such an action is simply not rational, not justified: one cannot have reason to do it" (261, n12).  Apparently, any consideration admitted to the deliberative field is thereby represented as sufficient justification for action.

Distinguish this from two other claims.  First, the claim that any end the agent sets she thereby represents as sufficiently ("objectively," "agent-neutrally") justified.  This is roughly Wood's and Korsgaard's view, and it is often attributed to Aquinas as well as to Kant.[6]  I believe this view is false, and that there are many cases where agents represent their ends as insufficiently justified.  Even those who share this view, however, should be surprised by Herman's more controversial position that any consideration we genuinely treat as a possible reason for acting we thereby represent as a sufficient justification for action.  Second, distinguish Herman's position from the claim that a highly virtuous agent, whose deliberative field is framed by an unshakeable commitment to and sophisticated understanding of the moral law, has a deliberative field containing only reasons that are sufficient justifications for acting.  This strikes me as more plausible, which gives me further reason to doubt that we not-especially-virtuous mere mortals tacitly represent all of our reasons as sufficient justifications.

As I aim to become more virtuous, understanding virtue along the lines Herman gives us, I aim to improve the contents of my deliberative field, to ensure that a greater number of them are in fact sufficient justifications for acting.  But, if I read her correctly, Herman would have it that I am at the same time tacitly committed to those contents already being sufficient justifications.  So my project of self-improvement relies on an odd sort of inconsistency between my explicit and tacit evaluations of my motivations.  To do away with this inconsistency, Herman would have to allow that sometimes our choices are based on reasons that we don't believe are particularly good reasons, but that we choose to act on, nonetheless.  Then, however, it would be difficult to prove that her theory of character and virtue must have Kantian metaphysics of the will at its root.  This theory is new and exciting, and I share Herman's desire to show that it vindicates Kant's conception of the will.  I'm not yet persuaded that it does, but anticipate that a valuable discussion will be inspired by Herman's work.

VII. Overview of Chapters

1. "Making Room for Character" constructs a Kantian model of moral judgment and action drawing on a conception of character that includes nonmoral desires, and argues that this conception is better at capturing the role of character in the moral life than is the Aristotelian.

2. "Pluralism and the Community of Judgment" argues against tolerance as the first moral response to the fact of pluralism.  Instead, there is a moral requirement prior to the encounter with pluralistic values to create an increasingly inclusive community of moral judgment.

3. "A Cosmopolitan Kingdom of Ends" provides an alternative to the widely-received constructivist interpretations of the Kingdom of Ends: the Kingdom is an archetypical community of moral judgment.

4. "Responsibility and Moral Competence" argues that the motive of duty should be seen as a "backstop" motive that provides the foundation for moral character.

5. "Can Virtue Be Taught?  The Problem of New Moral Facts" outlines the kinds of social institutions and moral education needed to make the good moral character developed in the previous chapter responsive to new moral facts.

6. "Training to Autonomy: Kant and the Question of Moral Education" opposes the standard understanding of Kant's theory of moral education, according to which the aim of moral education is to teach the separateness of moral (dutiful) and nonmoral (hedonic) motives and to train dispositions to accede to moral motives.  Instead, education should aim at creating the desires and ends that enhance the capacity for rational agency.

7. "Bootstrapping" analyzes both Harry Frankfurt's and Christine Korsgaard's theories of the will and argues they cannot establish that, when we act morally, the content and authority of our reasons is determined by a nonrelative moral value.  This desideratum can be satisfied only by Kantian metaphysics of the will.

8. "Rethinking Kant's Hedonism" opposes the common interpretation of Kant's remarks on hedonism, according to which all nonmoral action aims at pleasure.  Instead, Kant's concern is that, without a nonhedonic moral principle, the only principle of choice available is the maximization of pleasure.  Worse, the latter provides no basis for choosing the means to an overall pleasurable life in the face of stronger present inclination.

9. "The Scope of Moral Requirement" uses Kant's notion of the two obligatory ends -- one's own perfection and others' happiness, which jointly constitute the material final end of human action -- to argue that many duties can be specified only relationally.

10. "The Will and Its Objects" defends two theses: "desire is not primitive," and the rational will is "a kind of faculty of desire expressed in a norm-constituted ability."  It further argues that, if these theses are true, then all rational willing implicitly aims at satisfying the moral law.

11. "Obligatory Ends" further develops the concept of obligatory ends to show that they play multiple roles in moral deliberation and choice: they limit the premises we may employ in practical reasoning; they function as "categories" that direct our affective and conceptual practical development; and they set positive duties.  It further argues that the specific obligatory ends to perfect oneself and promote others' happiness can be derived from the nature of choice and deliberation.

12. "Moral Improvisation" continues to mine the concept of obligatory ends to develop a morality of positive duties that includes extending the realm of responsibility to include unintended consequences, negligence and ignorance; (limited) space for moral creativity and the creation of new obligations; the relevance of the history of a wrong to the right response; and a degree of leeway in deciding how imperfect duties will fit into one's life.

13. "Contingency in Obligation" develops a tension between two intuitive features of the ideal moral life: seamlessness between moral and nonmoral behavior in local conditions shaped by local values, and a grounding in universal and objective value.  This tension can be lessened, if not entirely resolved, by permitting moral improvisation and enhancing agents' abilities to extend universal values in new ways.

[1] Anscombe, "Modern Moral Philosophy", Philosophy 33 (1958):1-19; Foot, Virtues and Vices and Other Essays in Moral Philosophy (Berkeley and Los Angeles: University of California Press, 1978); MacIntyre, After Virtue (London, Duckworth, 1985); Stocker, "The Schizophrenia of Modern Ethical Theories", Journal of Philosophy 14 (1976):453-66.

[2] For example, Onora O'Neill, "Kant After Virtue," Inquiry 26 (1984); Robert B. Louden, "Kant's Virtue Ethics," Philosophy 61:238 (1986):473-89; Marcia Baron, Kantian Ethics Almost Without Apology (Cornell: Cornell U.P., 1995); Nancy Sherman, Making a Necessity of Virtue (New York: Cambridge U.P., 1998).  Christine Korsgaard's version of Kant is increasingly Aristotelian.  See especially her "Acting for a Reason,"

forthcoming in Studies in Practical Reason, edited by V. Bradley Lewis, from Catholic University Press.

[3] See Brian Byrne, "Theories of Learning to Read," in The Science of Reading: A Handbook, ed. Snowling and Hulme (Blackwell, 2005), 104-119.

[4] Wood, Kant's Ethical Thought (Cambridge: Cambridge U.P., 1999), chapter 4.

[5] See especially Korsgaard, "Kant's Formula of Humanity," in her Creating the Kingdom of Ends (Cambridge: Cambridge U.P., 1996), 106-132; and The Sources of Normativity (Cambridge: Cambridge U.P., 1996), chapter 2.

[6] See Thomas E. Hill, Jr., "Personal Values and Setting Oneself Ends," in his Human

Welfare and Moral Worth (Oxford: Clarendon, 2002): 244-74 for a persuasive argument that this is not Kant's view.