Moral Perception

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Robert Audi, Moral Perception, Princeton University Press, 2013, 194pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780691156484.

Reviewed by Antti Kauppinen, Trinity College Dublin/University of Jyväskylä


In everyday parlance, we sometimes report having seen that an audience member's standing up to a sexist keynote speaker was morally good or having heard how a husband wronged his wife. In philosophy, the idea that we can literally perceive moral facts has not exactly been popular, but it has had its proponents.[1] In this volume, Robert Audi, who can lay claim to being the leading contemporary moral epistemologist in the intuitionist tradition, develops what is perhaps the most comprehensive defence of the possibility of moral perception to date.

What is moral perception? Suppose I see a teenager drowning a reluctant hamster. I may form the moral belief that the action is wrong straight away, without any conscious inference. This much is common ground between proponents of moral perception and sceptics about it. But where sceptics think that the quick belief is based on non-conscious inference or association or perhaps emotional response, those who believe in moral perception take it to be based on a distinct moral perceptual experience, which can justify the belief in the same way perception in general does.

The first step in making the case is clarifying what happens in perception in general. Audi takes this task up in the first chapter. As is his wont, he makes a series of careful distinctions, starting with three main kinds of perception. They are simple perception (seeing a flower), attributive perception (seeing a flower to be yellow), and propositional perception (seeing that a flower is yellow). The content of perceptual experience is formed by properties that are phenomenally represented in it. Such experience is distinct from belief -- we need not have beliefs corresponding to the content of our perception. For us to perceive something is for it to "produce or sustain, in the right way, an appropriate phenomenal representation of it" (20). We see an object by seeing some suitable subset of its properties. Roughly, an object instantiates an observable property, which causes me to instantiate a phenomenal property (such as being appeared to elliptically).

How about moral perception? Audi does not claim we can perceive that drowning the hamster is wrong in the same way we can perceive that a hat is red. Moral properties are not perceptual like colours and shapes, but they are perceptible. We perceive them by way of perceiving the non-moral properties they are grounded or consequential on. The phenomenal aspect of moral perception is a non-sensory "sense of injustice" (37) or a "felt sense of connection" (39) between the moral property, such as wrongness, and the perceived base property, such as intentionally causing pain to an animal. This representational element isn't "pictorial" or "cartographic" (37) as it might be in paradigmatic cases of perception, but, Audi says, we shouldn't expect that to be the case when it comes to moral properties. Nor are moral properties directly causally responsible for the phenomenal properties; rather, the relevant causal connection obtains between instantiations of base properties and instantiations of the distinctively moral phenomenal states.

Here a natural objection arises. Perhaps what happens in purported cases of moral perception is that we perceive some non-moral facts F, which form the minor premise in a possibly non-conscious inference to a moral conclusion M. The real justificatory work is done by some antecedently held moral principle of the form F -> M, which forms the major premise of the inference. Contrary to Audi, there is no "perceptual warrant" (45) for F -> M. Perception doesn't tell us that causing pain to an innocent animal is wrong (or wrong-making). Any warrant must come from elsewhere.

Audi has various responses to this inferentialist objection. The main line is a kind of partners-in-crime argument: if we limit what we can perceive to the narrowly observable, we will have to treat many other things we take ourselves to perceive as inferential. Can I not see that someone is angry rather than merely seeing that she is red-faced and screaming and then inferring on that basis that she is angry? Can't I see a smile rather than a face arranged in a certain way, or a home run when watching a game of baseball?[2] Audi's strong claim is that if we reject the perceptibility of moral properties, we must "treat as inferential all our perceptual beliefs except the most elementary" (52). (This, to be sure, is an option that some have been willing to take.)

It seems to me that the success of this crucial argument hangs on the metaphysical relationship between base properties and moral properties being relevantly similar to that between perceptual properties and perceptible properties in the uncontroversial cases. Clearly, there is a difference, as Audi acknowledges. If I see that you're angry by seeing your furrowed brow, it's because your expression manifests your state. If I see a smile by way of seeing a happy countenance, it's because the happy countenance constitutes a smile. Similarly, I see a home run by seeing some of the constituent facts, such as seeing the ball go over the stands. In the moral case, however, unless reductive naturalism is true (and Audi doesn't assume that it is), the moral property is consequential or grounded on the perceivable non-moral property, where being consequential entails supervenience. And the sceptic will argue that I can not perceive F by perceiving the fact that it is consequential on. After all, it is not in general true that I can perceive a fact that supervenes on another by perceiving the base fact -- I can't see that you're angry by seeing a scan of your brain activity. If I am a suitably trained scientist, I may be in a position to make the inference, or perhaps just respond discriminatively on the basis of skill and experience, but these are not cases of perception. (Why not? I'm not sure, but there has to be some constraint on when an experience can phenomenally represent things as being in a certain way, even if we leave the pictorial model of representation behind.)

Audi might respond by saying that since moral properties are "constitutively anchored" in natural ones "in an intimate way" (57), there is a difference in this respect in the grounding relation compared to the mind-brain case. But it's not clear to me how this argument could be made -- it seems to me that moral properties, being normative, are if anything less intimately connected to their natural base properties than mental properties are to brain properties (unless of course reductivist naturalism about morality is true). One thing Audi does point out is that moral and natural facts can be reliably linked (43), but reliable linkage isn't sufficient for perception -- you can't see a ship by just seeing its wake.

As far as I can see, Audi has two further arguments for moral perception. The first is that we can see that drowning the hamster is wrong without believing that it is. A fortiori, we don't infer to the conclusion that it is. If this is true, it supports postulating a non-doxastic state with moral content -- but further argument is needed to make the case that it is a perceptual feature of the subject. Second, coming to see that some action is good can be a holistic process, parallel to aesthetic evaluation: "The relevant patterns are seen or apprehended in a holistic way, not specified by a list of the constituent properties and relations" (117). This might be thought of as Audi's nod to particularism. If such uncodifiability exists, it certainly poses a challenge to the picture of non-conscious inference. But again, it is not clear if perception is the only alternative. What about intuition or emotion, for example? Could they not provide non-inferential and possibly holistic epistemic support for moral belief? Even if we accept Audi's arguments against the inferential picture of moral knowledge, the defender of moral perception has to make the further case that other non-inferential sources of moral knowledge do not suffice to account for the phenomena.

The second part of the book is about the relation of moral perception to moral intuition and emotion. Here Audi brings his earlier treatment of intuition closer to recently popular quasi-perceptualist views of intuition. He talks about "intellectual perception" (89), which comes in the same varieties as sense perception, and may produce "intuitive seemings" (91), non-doxastic states that can cause and support corresponding beliefs (doxastic intuitions). Some intuitions have as their content a self-evident proposition, roughly a proposition one is justified in believing merely on the basis of adequate understanding. Such self-evident propositions include pro tanto principles that posit a right- or wrong-making relation between natural and moral properties, such as the relation between killing and wrongness (115). But we can also have intuitions about particular cases, such as the intuition of wrongness we may have when observing someone dropping banana peels on top of a public staircase (99). Such intuitions may not be quick or unreflective, but may instead require reflection and concentration on the details of the case.

So it seems that for Audi, we can both intuit and perceive the wrongness of a particular action. But once intuition and perception are brought so close together, two questions arise: What's the difference, and do we really need both notions? Why insist on moral sense perception in addition to intellectual moral perception? One thing Audi says is that perception is a "major route" to moral intuition (121). I perceive that failing to acknowledge a kind gesture is ungrateful, and as a consequence intuit that the failure is ungrateful. But why not think that what I perceive is the failure of acknowledgement, and then, given my possession of the concept of ingratitude, immediately intellectually apprehend that what I've perceived is ungrateful behaviour? It is not quite clear to me what talk of literal perception adds. Some of the things Audi says suggest that perceptions are more vivid and immediate, but why couldn't intuitions vary along these dimensions?

Perceptions and intuitions aren't the only non-doxastic states that can give rise to belief: there are also emotions. This invites a hypothesis that is even simpler than the intuitionist one: perhaps so-called moral perceptions and intuitions are just emotions. When Audi talks about the experiential aspect of moral perception he uses phrases like "phenomenal sense of wrongdoing" (45). This sounds a lot like a feeling. So maybe what happens when I see the hamster being drowned is that I have an emotional response, perhaps some form of indignation, and this leads me to believe that the action I observe is wrong.[3] No one denies that such emotional responses exist. Can they do the job that perceptions or intuitions are supposed to do? Should we say that the purported moral perceptions or intuitions just are emotions?

Audi denies that emotions could substitute for intuitions or perceptions. He notes that emotions can't be true or false, while doxastic intuitions can. This is true, but leaves open the more plausible thesis that some emotions constitute moral seemings or appearances. The next argument is that intuitions, unlike emotions, are not intrinsically motivational (124). Audi uses the intuition of the validity of an argument as an example. But this obviously doesn't rule out moral seemings or intuitions being constituted by emotions. Next, seemings or intuitions can have propositional content -- what about emotions? On Audi's take, the cognitive component of an emotion is often "something believed about the object" (126), although it can be an intuition, too (133). On this issue, Audi has little to say. He doesn't make some familiar distinctions, such as that between the target and the formal object of an emotion, nor is he very clear on the difference between what elicits an emotion and how the emotion itself presents things as being. Since Audi doesn't work with a very sophisticated view of emotion, his arguments against identifying moral perceptions or intuitions or seemings with emotions remain inconclusive.

It is not that Audi thinks emotions play no epistemic role in ethics. In customary fashion, he distinguishes among a number of different justificatory roles for emotion. Sometimes it transmits justification. One perceives that something is wrong, and then intuits that it is, which is evidence for, and the causal basis for, an emotion. The cognition "gives the emotion an element of justification that enables it to provide, in turn, evidence for a moral judgment" (137). But emotions can also be sensitive to holistic patterns we're not able to articulate, as when one is afraid in an unusual situation without being able to put one's finger on what's wrong. In such cases, emotion may be theevidential basis of intuition (139). However, Audi doesn't attempt to say anything systematic about what emotions might be trustworthy and when.

As the above discussion may indicate, Audi's philosophical temperament is, for want of a better word, Aristotelian. He aims to find the truth in seemingly competing views on moral knowledge by making precise distinctions and leaving a large role for contingency. 'Mays' and 'mights' abound when Audi describes how we come to know something is right. Sometimes emotion comes before intuition, sometimes after, and sometimes, but not always, one or the other is preceded by moral perception. The more Platonically inclined among us might hope for a simpler, more parsimonious account showing why the attraction of some positions is only apparent. Indeed, as I have suggested, even if we accept a large part of what Audi says, perceptually based intuitions or emotions might suffice to account for the phenomena without the need to postulate literal moral perception. Be that as it may, no one interested in the issue can afford to bypass this volume.[4]


Blum, L. 1994. Moral Perception and Particularity. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Cuneo, T. 2003. "Reidian Moral Perception". Canadian Journal of Philosophy 33 (2), 229- 258.

Döring, S. 2007. "Seeing What to Do". dialectica 363-394.

Jacobson, D. 2005, "Seeing By Feeling". Ethical Theory and Moral Practice 8 (4), 387-409.

McNaughton, D. 1988. Moral Vision. Oxford: Blackwell.

Prinz, J. 2004. Gut Reactions. New York: Oxford University Press.

[1] Prominent defenders of moral perception include David McNaughton (1988) and Lawrence Blum (1994). Terence Cuneo's (2003) Reidian view of moral perception is in many ways similar to Audi's. Curiously, Audi discusses none of these views.

[2] The home run example is Cuneo's (2003, 256).

[3] Daniel Jacobson (2005) argues that we're better off understanding talk of seeing moral truths as a metaphor that we can cash out in terms of emotional responses issuing from a virtuous sensibility. Sabine Döring (2007), in contrast, argues that emotions themselves constitute perceptions. Jesse Prinz (2004) contains a systematic defence of emotions as perceptions.

[4] I thank Lilian O'Brien and Pekka Väyrynen for perceptive remarks on an earlier draft of this review.