Moral Philosophy in Eighteenth-Century Britain: God, Self, and Other

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Colin Heydt, Moral Philosophy in Eighteenth-Century Britain: God, Self, and Other, Cambridge University Press, 2018, 289pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781108421096.

Reviewed by David McNaughton, Florida State University


Anyone familiar with eighteenth century British moral philosophy will have come across a tri-partite division of duties into those we owe to God, to others, and to ourselves. The widespread and unremarked acceptance of this division reflects, Colin Heydt claims, the entrenchment of a theory of rights and duties, a Protestant natural law theory if you will, that is found in the writings of Pufendorf and, to a lesser degree, Grotius. Not only would this theory be familiar to all writers in Britain (and, significantly, the American colonies) but Heydt further claims it became 'the default position by being propagated in the university, especially through the curriculum, and through textbooks' (p. 5). This historical claim is backed up with an impressive wealth of scholarship. If it were to be challenged, it would only be by appeal to the number of prominent writers on morals in the eighteenth century who diverge from, or are even actively hostile to, this tradition. Such figures would include Shaftesbury, Mandeville, Butler, Hutcheson, Hume, and Bentham. Heydt's response to this challenge is to claim that 'by foregrounding the century's conventions [his book] also shows more clearly what was unorthodox, disturbing, and interesting' about the work of such writers (p. 13). Focusing on what was the 'conventional' view can, therefore, help us to understand what those who amended or rejected it were reacting against, and also help us see whether they were fair in their criticisms. In addition, concentration on the practical ethics of the period rather than on their moral metaphysics, serves as a corrective to the predominant tendency in recent history of philosophy to focus on the latter.

The book naturally falls into four parts. The first spells out the way in which Pufendorf's natural law ethics superseded more traditional ways of construing practical ethics. A casual perusal of the primary literature might lead one to think that virtue theory must have been the standard view in eighteenth century Britain, since the word 'virtue' and its synonyms occur so often. Heydt argues, however, that appearances are deceptive. The notion of duty was central, and that of virtue was marginalized. Indeed, as he shows with copious quotation, virtue was interpreted by many as simply a disposition to do one's duty. Crucial Aristotelian claims -- that eudaemonia is the goal of human life, that feelings as well as actions need to be shaped and controlled, and that one needs practical wisdom to discern the appropriate thing to do -- are largely absent. The exceptions to this prevailing view are Shaftesbury, Hume, and (more ambiguously) Hutcheson. Natural law orthodoxy places the emphasis on law and justice (the virtue with which Aristotelianism has most difficulty), and on motivation by a sense of duty. Feelings and emotions are relegated to the role of either hindering or helping dutiful action. Some room for judgment is allowed in the area of imperfect duties -- positive duties to help one's fellow humans -- but virtually no role is left for the phronemos.

While there was widespread agreement about the tripartite division of duties, there was much discussion about the status of rights. In his third chapter Heydt argues that duties were usually taken to be explanatorily prior to rights, and thus there were very few rights theorists proper. This is the only part of the book that I found somewhat obscure, both as to what this view is, and what the arguments for it were. He points out that many theorists were reluctant to allow that there were any duties that were not correlated with rights since duties were understood as directed and relational. But this does nothing to show the priority of duty since, as Heydt explains, 'correlativity can be understood as mutual entailment' (p. 64).

So what is it to hold that duties have priority? Objecting to Hobbes' claim that, in the state of nature, everyone has a right to everything, his opponents typically argued that this was not a proper right, but mere license, since there is no correlative duty in play. But, again, a need for correlation would not show that duties are explanatorily prior. If I understand correctly, defenders of this explanatory priority held that we have rights only insofar as having them enables us to fulfil our duties. Perhaps the clearest account of this position is given by Witherspoon, who is quoted by Heydt as follows:

Right in general may be reduced, as to its source, to the supreme law of moral duty; for whatever men are in duty obliged to do, that they have a claim to, and other men are considered as under an obligation to permit them. (pp. 77-8)

But this does not ease my perplexity. It seems to work well for duties to myself: if I have such a duty, others need to leave room for me to fulfil it. But what grounds my duty to others? Surely something about the others that gives them rights. I cannot see how the Witherspoon formula makes any sense of such duties. Moreover, if Pufendorf and his followers are espousing a theory that is properly described as a theory of natural rights, how can it be that duty takes priority?

Writers recognised that there were problem cases for the claim that all duties had correlative rights. There were four areas in which, though we have duties, it is arguable that there are no rights holders. These four are: imperfect duties, duties to God, duties to self, and duties to non-rational beings (animals and children). Disagreement about this issue with respect to God reflected differing theological commitments. On one conception, God may deserve or merit our reverence and praise, which grounds a duty to worship him, but it would be inappropriate to say that he has a right to it. On a more juridical conception of our relation to God, God has a right to demand these things of us.

Not everyone held that duties have explanatory priority. Heydt cites Adam Smith as the main dissenter. As Heydt puts it:

Natural rights are grounded, not by their necessity in promoting obligatory ends of natural law, but through our propensity as spectators to resent certain kinds of harm. (p. 79)

But this seems to me not a theory that invokes natural rights at all, but some other kind of beast.

Part II covers duties to God. Differing theological and philosophical positions informed arguments about whether divine revelation is required to bring us to obedience to the moral law. This argument centred on epistemic, motivational, and epistemic issues rather than the actual content of the moral law. Those who argued for the necessity of revelation claimed that, without it, 'we cannot know the moral law sufficiently, be motivated to do it, or recognize its authority over us' (p. 97). On this approach, there could be no truly virtuous pagans. I note in passing that some of the criticisms of the Ancients by this camp reveal an unpleasant smugness about the superiority of Christendom. Heydt quotes John Brown: 'The Greeks and Romans committed and boasted of the most cruel enormities, conquered and enslaved innocent nations' (p. 100). The implication, that the British had a better record in this respect, is breathtaking.

Some went so far as to deny that there are duties to God. Two notable outliers were Hume and, according to Heydt, Smith. For Hume, it is not merely that if there is no God, we cannot have duties to him. Rather, piety even among believers is not a virtue but a vice. For Hume, belief in the Christian God makes the human mind sink 'into the lowest submission and abasement' (p. 110). In an extensive and penetrating discussion of Smith, Heydt argues that Smith's account of ethics is primarily, and maybe wholly, naturalistic. His explanations do not rely on appeal to providential ordering and -- most strikingly -- in 'Of the Character of Virtue', which was added to the last edition of A Theory of Moral Sentiments published in his lifetime, there is no place for piety. Thus, Heydt suggests, Smith is closer to Hume on these matters than many have supposed.

Of the three categories of duty with which this book is concerned, none is more contentious, and more puzzling, than duties to oneself. If we think of these duties as something we owe to ourselves, in the way that we owe duties to others, then they seem impossible. Since one can always be released from a debt, duties to self could always be waived by the self to whom they were owed. Various solutions suggest themselves. It can be argued that duties to self are at best indirect; our duties to God or to others require us to keep ourselves in good shape. Without the (possibility of) interaction with others, there would be no such duties. It might be irrational, because imprudent, for a Robinson Crusoe in a Godless world to look after his own interests, or to develop his talents, but it would not be morally deplorable. We have the right to go to hell in our own way. Those who thought there were such duties, such as Butler, had a different conception of what was significant about the self. Because we are 'fearfully and wonderfully made', we have a duty to respect our own dignity and value, just as we have a duty to respect the dignity of others. We would still have this duty in virtue of our own natures, even if we had no maker. Prudence, on this view, is itself one aspect of morality. Heydt takes us in detail through a number of versions of such solutions put forward by eighteenth century thinkers. The issue is very much alive to this day, and the disputes surrounding it mark deep divisions about our conception of why humans matter morally. I could not help reflecting on reading this well researched chapter (and, indeed, the book as a whole) how much contemporary moral philosophy would be enriched by a fuller knowledge of these earlier discussions. Those who do not know history are not only compelled to repeat it; they are unable to avoid mistakes that have been frequently exposed. It's a waste of time and effort to reinvent the wheel; it is even worse if our invention is inferior to what came before.

The final chapter in this section focuses on varying degrees of pessimism and optimism about the possibility of self-cultivation and self-improvement. The pessimists stress the stubbornness of human nature, and see the best we can do as setting up external checks to control or channel unruly passions. The optimists maintain that reason and reflection can do much to improve our inner character. Equally important, I would think, is the division between those who think that self-improvement comes through the subjugation or elimination of the passions, and those who hold that our desires and emotions are not intrinsically bad, and can be shaped by education. While Heydt touches on this topic, it perhaps deserves more coverage.

The final section concerns duties to others. Many agreed that each of us has a natural right to life, liberty, property, and reputation. Divergence centred on whether, and to what extent, such rights are indefeasible or unalienable, as radicals claimed they were. Conservatives of various hues managed to square the existence of these rights with patriarchal marriage and even slavery. There was also considerable discussion of the permissibility of polygamy during this period: a fairly common view held that it was not prohibited by natural law, but that monogamy was preferable. To my surprise, this was actually a live issue in Britain; Charles II consulted future bishop Gilbert Burnet on whether he could take a second wife! Polyandry, by contrast, was universally condemned, on the rather unconvincing grounds that it would place obstacles in the way of men caring for their children. The book ends with an excellent account of different views on the right to resistance and rebellion.

Heydt's scholarship is formidable. For those immersed in the literature of the period, this book will further their researches. For those, like this reviewer, who lack background knowledge in which to place the great figures, Heydt supplies a huge amount of information that could not otherwise be obtained except by great (and even tedious) labour.  All those interested in eighteenth century ethics are in his debt.