Moral Progress in Dark Times: Universal Values for the Twenty-First Century

Moral Progress Gabriel

Markus Gabriel, Moral Progress in Dark Times: Universal Values for the Twenty-First Century, Wieland Hoban (trans.), Polity Press, 2022, 267pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781509549481.

Reviewed by Erica Lucast Stonestreet, College of St. Benedict and St. John’s University


Markus Gabriel’s Moral Progress in Dark Times aims to revive moral realism as an antidote to the forces of chaos and uncertainty that characterize our current historical moment. His central claim is that there are universal, objective moral values which we humans are capable of grasping—contra many cultural influences that seem to have put us out to sea, morally speaking. Thus there is such a thing as moral progress, and it not only lies within our power to make it, but it is urgent that we do so. Significantly, the book does not engage directly with many of what we might think are typical metaethical debates: Gabriel does not address the metaphysical and epistemological questions around what precisely it is that makes moral claims true, or how we know them. His primary strategy is to argue against currently dominant postmodern, relativistic views that tend to undermine moral realism, thus making it “safe” to believe in moral truths (and truth in general). On the whole, the book offers a sense of a way forward out of our “dark times,” though Gabriel is far from naïve about the difficulty of the project.

The target views that Gabriel addresses include moral relativism in various forms, the widespread (often implicit) naturalistic belief that all knowledge and all progress are scientific-technological, and the (merely) biological and economic conceptions of the human being. He also places significant blame on the internet for amplifying and entrenching all of these views.

“What characterizes the dark times in which everything suggests we are living,” Gabriel writes, “is that the light of moral insight is sometimes systematically concealed, for example by the dissemination of fake news, political manipulation, propaganda, ideologies and other worldviews” (8). To combat these forces, first of all, we need a place to stand. The first half of the book aims to provide that place. It consists of an exposition of “the New Moral Realism,” as Gabriel terms his position, together with Gabriel’s replies to what amounts to a set of objections derived from the target views. New Moral Realism, which he also calls the “new enlightenment,” consists of three easily stated theses:

  1. Moral realism: There are objective moral facts that are independent of opinions.
  2. Humanism: These facts are essentially knowable and the central ones are obvious when not distorted by propaganda.
  3. Universalism: These facts apply at all times and places; they are universal.

The book does not provide much by way of direct defense of these claims, other than what amounts to an appeal to common sense. Gabriel’s strategy is largely to rely on the idea that once pervasive objections to New Moral Realism are shown to be mere enticing appearances, what’s left—moral realism—can be taken at face value and must be the case.

Gabriel’s defense of his central theses relies on a distinction between values and value concepts. Values are simply the thin categories of good, neutral, and evil: the morally necessary, permissible, and forbidden. He claims, plausibly, that these values are universal, and they are the standards against which all “value concepts” are measured. They require no justification beyond themselves; that is, they are not justified by evolution or the commands of a deity. They simply are the case, and we (can) know it. Value concepts are thick or concrete moral claims, such as that it is wrong to provide an abortion, or that homosexual sex is morally permissible. These are the specific moral facts about which we can be mistaken.

The reason we can’t always see this, Gabriel suggests, is that moral truths are masked by the pervasive influence of postmodern, relativistic distortions of reality (propagated to an unprecedented extent by the internet). He rehearses some of the standard defenses against relativism and its cousins, for instance explaining disagreement and error as the result of mistakes about non-moral facts. He goes on to address a number of other objections reasonably successfully, though the argumentation is dense and the narrative structure is at times difficult to follow.

One significant problem with moral realism in general is the sense that most of our moral principles (such as “it is wrong to lie”) have exceptions—and if that’s the case, it’s difficult to see in what sense such principles could be both true and universal, in which case they can’t be facts as such. Though it isn’t stated clearly, I take it that this is the worry that motivates Gabriel’s discussion of Kantian ethics in Chapter 2, “Why there are moral facts but not ethical dilemmas.” His response is to argue that these very general moral principles are not the real moral facts (or “value concepts,” as he terms them): because of moral complexity, we can only figure out what to do when we have the right description of the situation to yield moral insight. The resulting emphasis on context and particularism seems right. But it comes with baggage: this is what Gabriel calls the “hard descriptive problem of ethics,” and it helps to explain our fallibility with respect to moral questions. But he offers no real advice on how to solve this problem. While this is not strictly necessary to defend the claim that moral knowledge is possible, it is disappointing and may tend to weaken the skeptical reader’s confidence in New Moral Realism.

The second half of the book deals with the implications of New Moral Realism for tackling the problems of our dark times. The central claim in Chapter 3, “Social Identity: Why Racism, Xenophobia, and Misogyny are Evil,” is that identity politics is morally problematic, because the stereotypes on which identity politics is based are not real. The idea is that, even in the service of righting past wrongs, groupings based on stereotypes—which automatically divide people—go against universalism and are thus morally wrong. Identity politics needs to be given up in favor of “difference politics” (characterized as a matter of recognizing that everyone is an other to others)—and ultimately color blindness. This is likely where some readers will get off the bus. But Gabriel is well aware that even though concepts like race are social constructs, they have real consequences, and what he says here ultimately makes a fair amount of sense. Stereotypes based on artificial groupings (such as race) are illusory and divisive, and thus are contrary to reality and distort moral perception. The problem he sees with identity politics is not that it places value on group membership; it’s that it bases group membership on non-existent identities. So, I take it, what unites an oppressed group, and thus can be the basis of their rational association, is not the stereotyped feature that forms the basis for their oppression (e.g., skin color), but the experience of oppression. According to Gabriel, understanding group membership this way accords better with facts, points us away from identity politics, and thus harmonizes with moral realism.

The final chapter, “Moral Progress in the Twenty-First Century,” argues that moral progress—“becoming better at recognizing what we should and shouldn’t do” (11), largely by “recognizing and revealing moral facts that have been partly concealed” (188)—can come about if we adopt New Moral Realism. And if this is the case, human progress—“cooperation between scientific, technological and moral progress with ethically defensible aims” (220)—is also possible. Gabriel believes we’ve “lost our ability to orient ourselves towards an ethical conception of the human being” (191) because purely economic and biological conceptions have taken over, and we’ve come to assume that the only facts there are are non-moral ones. There are many threads in this chapter, but one that stands out is his push against the assumption that behavioral economics is the best way to understand and predict human behavior. He points to studies that (contrary to a fundamental economic assumption) show that we do not strive exclusively for individual profit at others’ expense, and he argues that we are capable of continuing moral progress if we shift toward a more ethical conception of humanity and align all of our considerable non-moral knowledge toward moral ends. As he puts it, the project is ultimately about determining the right relationship between moral and non-moral facts, and importantly, he emphasizes a role for all domains of knowledge in this endeavor:

How we understand ourselves as human beings and as part of reality is examined in the humanities. Art, religion, the diversity of our languages and lifeworlds—all this is differentiated in an unfathomably complex way. The reality of the spirit contributes at least as much to the self-determination of humans as does the scientific examination of our survival conditions and their technological optimization. (232)

Gabriel believes that liberal democracy is still the right vehicle for the kind of moral compass and social organization that needs to take place—but it needs to include cosmopolitanism too, because the fate of all humanity is at stake. Democracy is the form of organization that “makes the principle of human dignity its priority” (243), and in theory, democratic debates aim at truth. This is surely rather aspirational at the moment, but it needs to be said in order to keep the ideal in view.

As noted above, the book doesn’t engage with many classic metaethical questions. This may not be a problem, however; the aim of the project is to revive the idea that there is solid ground for moral debate, and that we can make progress on moral issues. The precise details of the metaphysics and epistemology likely don’t matter much for this project, because the message is ultimately aimed at non-philosophical audiences. Unfortunately, the book is densely written, often not narratively cohesive, and thus not accessible to a general population. As an academic work, it won’t succeed in reaching those who most need to hear the message; still, to the extent that academic conversations over time influence the zeitgeist, it’s possible that this view would do the same if the ideas were taken up more widely in the academy. On the whole, the book’s themes that morality is real and grounded in facts, that scientific-technological progress should be guided by ethics, and that this requires heavy-duty interdisciplinary cooperation (including a role for the humanities!) as well as a fundamental belief in truth and human dignity, are desperately needed in our current historical moment.