Moral Psychology, Volume 4: Free Will and Moral Responsibility

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Walter Sinnott-Armstrong (ed.), Moral Psychology, Volume 4: Free Will and Moral Responsibility, MIT Press, 2014, 474pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780262525473.

Reviewed by Joshua Shepherd, University of Oxford


This is the fourth volume in Walter Sinnott-Armstrong's moral psychology series. The structure is as follows: ten target articles, two responses to each target article, and a further reply by target article authors. Target articles focus on recent empirical advances in our understanding of agency, and on the impacts these advances do or do not have for ongoing debates regarding free will and moral responsibility. Topics covered include the neuroscience of intention and choice, the nature of addiction, the experimental philosophy of free will, the importance of consciousness for control over action, and the relevance of neuroscience and biology generally for our understanding of free will and moral responsibility.

There is much to like about this volume. Sinnott-Armstrong has again done an excellent job orchestrating: topics are well-chosen, contributors include many leaders in both philosophy and cognitive science, and response authors are well-matched with target article authors. Much of the volume is pitched at a level accessible to both specialists and interested non-specialists alike. Given the attention these issues receive in the popular press, the accessibility of this volume strikes me as a strength. In what follows I briefly discuss each of the chapters, highlighting recurring themes along the way.

In the first target article, "Is Free Will an Illusion?", Eddy Nahmias considers the ways recent science does and does not threaten the existence of free will and moral responsibility. Nahmias has been writing on this topic for several years, and in my view this article is perhaps the most substantive stand-alone contribution to the literature in this volume.

Nahmias first considers and dismisses the thought that science is threatening because it shows that determinism is the case (his reasons largely mirror Adina Roskies', offered in chapter three). Nahmias then considers and dismisses the thought that science is threatening because it shows that naturalism -- "the view that everything that exists, including human minds, is part of the natural world and behaves in accordance with natural laws" (8) -- is the case. A bigger potential threat, according to Nahmias, is the possibility that 'modular epiphenomenalism' is true. This is the view that "those modules involved in conscious decisions or intention formation do not produce our behavior; rather other modules or processes that involve no conscious states produce our behavior" (12). Why is modular epiphenomenalism a threat? Because, according to Nahmias, "both ordinary intuitions and philosophical theories, compatibilist and incompatibilist alike, suggest that relevant conscious mental processes need to play some causal role in actions that we count as free and responsible" (12).

Nahmias makes the case that science has not (yet) shown anything like modular epiphenomenalism to be true. His argument is compelling, but I would like to focus on a different point. I think Nahmias is clearly right that ordinary intuitions give consciousness a central role to play (see Shepherd 2012 for evidence). But though some (not all) philosophical theories about free will and moral responsibility seem to give consciousness an important role to play, this role is rarely made explicit. Supposing for the moment it is, why is consciousness important? And how important is it? Is it necessary for free or responsible action?

In their response to Nahmias, Erman Misirlisoy and Patrick Haggard argue that consciousness is not very important at all. According to Misirlisoy and Haggard, "Neuroscience has rejected the idea that conscious intention, qua consciousness, plays any causal role in action" (40). Misirlisoy and Haggard note that while healthy adults typically report awareness of intention roughly 200 milliseconds before movement, patients with lesions to the parietal cortex as well as patients with Tourette's syndrome report such awareness at roughly 50 milliseconds before movement, and this "may be too late for conscious intention to exert any significant effect on action" (40). Perhaps this is right. But as Alfred Mele (2009) and others have argued, there is much beneath the surface here regarding how these experiments operationalize 'conscious intention,' regarding what it means to exert a 'significant effect' on action, and regarding what models of the causal role of intentions and of the experience of intention are being assumed here. From my point of view, this underscores the need for further reflection on just how consciousness is related to action, and on just what relations are in play when philosophers like Nahmias assert that consciousness is crucial for free or responsible action.

A further theme running through Nahmias' article -- and the volume as a whole -- concerns the importance of the meaning of terms like free will and moral responsibility. Nahmias argues that "because scientific claims about free will are being widely publicized, it is increasingly important to ensure that these claims match up with what people actually believe about free will" (2). A point that gets less attention in this volume is how to best determine whether what people believe about free will matches up with the truth about free will. In their response to Nahmias, Gunnar Björnsson and Derk Pereboom take up this point in two different ways. First, they argue that traditional philosophical debates about free will and moral responsibility surround the kind of free will that licenses attributions of desert, where "The desert at issue here is basic in the sense that the agent, to be morally responsible, would deserve to be the recipient of the expression of such an attitude just because she has performed the action, given sensitivity to its moral status" (27). Second, Björnsson and Pereboom note that though many now think that free will is compatible with naturalism, it remains unclear whether this is true of a desert-based understanding of free action. If that is right, then insofar as science offers (inductive) evidence for naturalism, as Nahmias claims, science may present a genuine threat to free will.

Philosophers who write on moral responsibility may be frustrated that aside from this first chapter, there is little contact with this way of understanding moral responsibility (although perhaps this is some evidence that many people take a desert-based approach to responsibility less seriously than such philosophers sometimes assume). On the whole, those who discuss the notion seem happy with a kind of pragmatic, socially driven approach to moral responsibility. This is especially apparent in the second target article by Michael Gazzaniga, "Mental Life and Responsibility in Real Time with a Determined Brain." Gazzaniga argues that there is no free will, but that even so moral responsibility is in good shape, since "it is a property of human social interactions, not mechanistic brains" (59). Gazzaniga is not asserting that desert-level responsible action is a property of human social interactions. Rather he seems to think that since human beings praise and blame each other and hold each other responsible, moral responsibility exists. Such a view leaves untouched the question of whether our responsibility practices are justified, and of how (if there is no free will) they might be.

Philosophers who write on free will likely find Gazzaniga's chapter frustrating. He asserts there is no free will, but his arguments make no connection with traditional sceptical arguments: Gazzaniga admits that "the intricacies of many of the classic discussions feel arcane to me" (60). At this point an optimistic reader might hope for some fresh sceptical argumentation. But instead Gazzaniga provides an overview of a broadly physicalistic picture of the world, and argues as follows: since the brain "works automatically and follows the laws of the natural world," it is "clear that the whole arcane issue about free will is a miscast concept" (73).

In his response, Daniel Dennett fairly criticizes Gazzaniga for rejecting a picture of free will that is itself, arguably, deeply flawed, insofar as it seems to require "our dear old friends from long ago: the ego, the immortal soul, impervious to causal influence, wellspring of choices so free that even God could not predict them in advance" (75). If that view of free will is implausible or incorrect -- a question that is discussed in detail in chapter five of this volume -- then Gazzaniga's picture looks less radical.

One theme taken up in Gazzaniga's chapter and in the responses to it concerns how empirically-fueled advances in our knowledge of the world bear on our understanding of free will. In an excellent response, William T. Newsome identifies one way that growing scientific knowledge might represent a genuine threat to free will. According to Newsome,

The critical question is whether our beliefs, values, and aspirations . . . are real entities with real causal efficacy in the world or whether they are illusory constructs that we make up to describe our experience of a world whose causal determinants lie at a much more fundamental level.

Many neuroscientists appear to subscribe to the latter point of view, leading to scepticism about our own ability to control our actions and effect change in the world. This conviction seems to be driven by a reductionist methodology (and ideology!) that is eliminative in the sense that it seeks to replace high-level constructs and processes with lower level explanations where fundamental truth is thought to lie. (93)

Newsome argues convincingly that current science does not counsel such eliminativism.

Adina Roskies writes the third target article, "Can Neuroscience Resolve Issues about Free Will?" Her subtle discussion will make for rewarding reading for anyone not familiar with her previous work on this issue. Here Roskies discusses some interesting neuroscientific work on perceptual decision making, argues that neuroscience is in no position to reveal the truth of determinism (for that, theoretical physics is the only place to look), and in the end espouses a scientifically informed compatibilism. Her position on neuroscience and determinism receives further elucidation via an interesting exchange with the neuroscientist Michael Shadlen, and her arguments for a scientifically informed compatibilism are challenged by the libertarian Robert Kane, who argues that his version of libertarianism is compatible with emerging science. (Incidentally, the issue of consciousness comes up again, with Kane asserting that "if conscious will were an illusion . . . all theories of freedom and responsibility would be threatened, compatibilist and libertarian alike, since they all require, to some degree at least, causally efficacious conscious mental processes" (129). But again, why is this a requirement?).

In the fourth target article, "The Neural Code for Intentions in the Human Brain: Implications for Neurotechnology and Free Will," the neuroscientist John-Dylan Haynes offers an interesting discussion of the difficulties of and prospects for decoding intentions with neurotechnology. This is followed by insightful responses from philosophers Tim Bayne and Timothy Schroeder. Among other things, Bayne emphasizes that sometimes very important differences in mental states hinge on something neuroscience is not yet in a position to detect: one's attitude towards a proposition (e.g., whether one fears or intends that a bomb will detonate). Schroder draws a distinction between short-term and long-term intentions, and notes that while current neurotechnology is making progress regarding short-term intentions, long-term intentions are a crucial facet of agency as well. In his reply, Haynes takes many of the relevant points on board, and notes a number of outstanding issues. What is the representational structure of intentions? How does the brain encode propositional attitudes? How do long-term intentions relate to short-term intentions?

One more comment about this chapter: the exchanges between Haynes, Bayne, and Schroeder provide a model for how engagement between scientists and philosophers can bear fruit. This is more than a feel-good point. Many philosophers complain (though not often in print) that scientists like to ride roughshod over conceptual issues that are critical for proper understanding and explanation of the natural world. And many scientists complain (though not often in print) that philosophers are over-concerned with minutia and fail to appreciate the importance of empirical evidence to our understanding of the natural world. There is ample motivation for both complaints. Even so, science is often enriched by the kind of attention to conceptual detail philosophers provide, and philosophy is often enriched by close attention to the data scientists provide. It is a virtue of this volume as a whole that it brings scientists and philosophers into generally fruitful contact.

The fifth chapter contains focused discussion of some recent experimental philosophy of free will. All of the pieces in it -- but especially Alfred Mele's target article, "Free Will and Substance Dualism" -- are important contributions to this literature. Mele considers a question that lurks throughout the volume, namely, whether "the meaning of 'free will' is such that having free will requires being or having a nonphysical soul or mind" (195). As earlier chapters make clear, if it does, then there is a distinct challenge to free will from those who claim that no such nonphysical soul or mind is needed to understand human agency.

Mele notes that many neuroscientists have framed the threat in this way. Then he offers experimental evidence that people do not in fact seem to understand free will in the soul-requiring way. As a result, "Any author who persists in claiming that we need to be or have nonphysical souls or minds to have free will should try to provide a defense of that claim" (205).

In his response, Thomas Nadelhoffer argues that things are more complicated than Mele's data suggest. Nadelhoffer presents data of his own that indicates that many people do seem to endorse an important connection between free will and the existence of souls (even if they do not find souls necessary for free will). What explains the difference between these data-sets? Nadelhoffer suggests that his experiments, which present abstract statements, might tap into folk theories about free will, while Mele's experiments, which present more concrete vignettes, might tap into folk intuitions about free will. Perhaps, but why would intuitions and theories come apart?

In his response, Manuel Vargas suggests an interesting (and arguably troubling) possibility. Perhaps folk views on free will are in some sense inconsistent. As Vargas puts it,

we have a messy, ill-behaved, imperfectly rational, and inconsistent web of thinking that underpins any 'convictions' about free will. Some of the doxastic elements will be, on reflection, bizarre. They might have implications we would never, in moments of calm, be inclined to accept. In the ordinary course of things, we are almost never completely committed to anything. Bizarre beliefs can live in the metaphysical foxholes of our lives, appearing when we are tired, sloppy, or have some incentive to think magically. (222-223)

This is an empirical hypothesis, and as such could be tested. One way to do so would be run various vignettes and abstract statements by the same sets (as opposed to the more common practice of using separate sets) of participants across time, in order to test for consistency. Or perhaps better methods are available. But certainly psychologists and philosophers need to think more about the epistemic assumptions underlying the kinds of studies often used to uncover the 'folk concept' of free will.

In the sixth target article, "Constructing a Scientific Theory of Free Will," the psychologist Roy F. Baumeister provides an interesting counterpoint to worries about consciousness' role in action production. According to Baumeister, conscious mental states and processes do have an important impact on behavior, even though the particular states and processes in question are often "several steps removed from actual behavior" (249). For Baumeister, "The role of consciousness is to evaluate, elaborate, refine, and in other ways alter, rather than start, the causal sequence that ends with action" (249).

What does this have to do with free will? Baumeister endorses a picture on which free action is primarily a matter of an agent's capacities to understand and apply socio-cultural, moral and practical norms in successful action. Since these capacities are, for Baumeister, biologically and psychologically based, free will comes in degrees. Agents are freer to the extent that they have better-functioning capacities for rational thought, self-control, and so on.

In their response to Baumeister, B. Keith Payne and C. Daryl Cameron largely endorse Baumeister's empirical approach, and emphasize the importance of understanding self-regulation for an empirically-based understanding of free will. In his response, Richard Holton also largely endorses Baumeister's approach. Interestingly, in doing so Holton downplays the kind of worries that animate philosophers like Nahmias and Mele regarding the meaning of free will. For Holton,

If we start with a definition [of free will], whether one developed by philosophers or one derived from surveying the masses, we start with something that reflects an implicit prior theory. . . . [Such theories] are prone to embody a vision of how we would like ourselves to be, and such a vision may be little encumbered by the facts of how we are. (261-262)

To be clear, Holton is not claiming that conceptual work is irrelevant to the empirical exploration of free will. Instead, he favors an ongoing back-and-forth between philosophy and science. I find such an approach salutary, especially regarding attempts to understand the actual mechanisms and capacities that undergird human agency. But there is a tension here (that runs throughout the volume) regarding the degree to which such an empirical approach can enlighten the kind of free will required for moral responsibility. For this appears to be a largely normative question, and one regarding which there remains much disagreement.

In the seventh target article, "The Freedom to Choose and Drug Addiction," the neuroscientist P. Read Montague provides a useful overview of recent work on the role of dopamine in reinforcement learning, and on the contribution of learning to addiction. In responses, Gideon Yaffe and Chandra Sripada take up the issue of the moral responsibility of addicts. Yaffe rejects a view on which the responsibility of addicts reduces to questions about the control over action addicts possess. Among other things, Yaffe highlights the fact that addicts often bear greater burdens related to refraining from engaging in addictive behaviors or taking addictive substances. Further, addiction might undermine not only control, but also an agent's normative competence -- an agent's capacity to recognize and properly respond to reasons. For these reasons, Yaffe argues that "if addicts' deficits in evaluative learning, rooted in dopamine signal dysfunction, matter to responsibility or freedom of will, it must be because they matter for reasons that are independent from control" (291).

Sripada takes up similar themes, noting two 'hits' in addiction. First, addicts suffer from desires of excessive strength. Second, addicts suffer from impaired abilities to behave in accordance with their reflective judgments as opposed to their wayward desires. Sripada proposes four (somewhat overlapping) explanatory models for understanding addiction, the fourth of which I found extremely interesting and suggestive. Roughly, the idea is that since over time addicts confront a much higher number of wayward desires than non-addicts, and since all of us have a non-zero failure rate at confronting our wayward desires, the relatively frequent failures of the addict at confronting wayward desires might (at least sometimes) be explained in a simple statistical way. Addicts have to confront wayward desires more often, so addicts will fail more often as well. Given that this is a response, Sripada is not able to go into much detail regarding this model or its implications for responsibility. Hopefully Sripada will have more to say in future work.

The eighth target article takes up an issue that hovers in the background throughout the volume, namely, that of control over behavior. In "Agency and Control: The Subcortical Role in Good Decisions," Patricia S. Churchland and Christopher L. Suhler review evidence indicating that nonconscious processes -- especially those subserving reinforcement learning and the kind of 'relevance determinations' that bias the framing of decision contexts and the allocation of attention -- are crucial for adaptive decision-making. They also reject a recently popular line of thought according to which agents have little control over behavior because of the pervasive influence of situations on judgments and decisions.

The review of relevant empirical work is a welcome contribution, as is the increased focus on the nature of control over behavior. Welcome, as well, are the responses by Christopher G. Coutlee and Scott A. Huettel, and by Neil Levy. Coutlee and Huettel offer an interesting distinction between model-based and model-free control, and make some good suggestions for how research on control might move forward. Levy stresses the importance of consciousness, and summarizes an intriguing view of the importance of consciousness to action -- one that gets much fuller treatment in Levy's new book (Levy 2014).

Churchland and Suhler's approach is disappointing in some ways as well. Instead of asking how an understanding of control might inform or impact our understanding of free will, they wish to replace talk of free will with talk of control. In their view "Wrangling over the metaphysical esoterica of free will is apt to be unproductive" (309). Since they do not say what such wrangling amounts to, however, it is difficult to know what kinds of work on free will draw their ire. They sometimes complain about "philosophers who seek a form of free will that is miraculously independent of causation" (325), but non-causal views of free will are rather in the minority even amongst metaphysical wranglers. Further, it is far from clear that replacing talk of free will with talk of control amounts to anything more than changing the subject (or refusing to engage with it).

Then there is the discussion of control itself. They offer an initial characterization of control as "the capacity of an individual to act in an intelligent and adaptive manner within a particular environment" (309) -- a characterization that prompts an urge to wrangle. After all, acting intelligently and acting adaptively are not necessarily the same thing. The latter is presumably about survival in some vague sense, while the former is notoriously difficult to make precise. Churchland and Suhler attempt to flesh the characterization of control out as follows.

Our hypothesis is that any animal with a healthy, functioning reinforcement learning system and a healthy system for maintaining homeostasis -- a normal regime of feeling pleasure and pain, responding to environmental inputs, and modifying pain -- is 'reason-responsive'. . . . At bottom . . . an essential function of nervous system is to coordinate all these factors in a way that is life maintaining for the individual. (322-323)

However, the action best supported by reasons is not always the one that is life maintaining (and for many actions, what is life maintaining will have little to do with the relevant reasons since many candidate actions will be sufficiently life maintaining). A useful account of control -- one that might link up with issues in the free will and moral responsibility literature -- requires a finer grain of analysis.

In the ninth target article, "Evolutionary Insights into the Nature of Choice: Evidence from Nonhuman Primates," Ellen E. Furlong and Laurie R. Santos review fascinating work by Santos's group at Yale indicating that many of the same reasoning and decision-making biases that characterize human cognition also characterize the cognition of nonhuman primates such as capuchin monkeys and orangutans. Given this evidence, Furlong and Santos then advance a broadly situationist position -- "that similarities in human and non-human decision-making biases hint that situational factors may act in a more automatic and encapsulated way than has previously been thought," and "that situational influences may be trickier to overcome than we think" (348). In responses, Brian Hare lauds their general evolutionary approach to understanding how the mind works, while Christian Miller pushes back, arguing that current evidence underdetermines what we should say about important issues such as the stability of our desires, and the extent to which human beings are bound to the mechanisms we share with our evolutionary ancestors. The relevant issues here could fill much more space, but the exchange, including Furlong and Santos's reply to these responses, provides an interesting glimpse into how one might apply an evolutionary perspective to advance understanding of human agency.

The tenth target article by Victoria K. Lee and Lasana T. Harris explores "A Social Perspective on Debates about Free Will." Lee and Harris, as well as responders Hannah A. Chapman and William A. Cunningham, advance considerations in favor of the view that membership in social groups, as well as the cognitive and motivational sensitivities to social rewards that subserve such membership, have much to do with the beliefs those in particular groups come to possess. Lee and Harris ask us to imagine "a typical academic": "social rewards greatly influence this person's choice of research topic and even his or her philosophical position on questions of free will. These social rewards come in many forms but consist of liking and respect from primarily ingroup members" (382).

I suspect that group belonging and other largely subterranean influences impact a philosopher's theories and intuitions more than most philosophers (myself included) are comfortable admitting. Consequently, I would find a rigorous and empirically informed social epistemology regarding the development of philosophical views (and regarding related issues such as the success or failure of philosophical arguments) most welcome. Even so, it is important to get the role of such influences just right, a point Manuel Vargas makes in an insightful response. Among other things, Vargas notes that group membership likely underdetermines many philosophical commitments. Further, Vargas argues that "we cannot explain free will debates without more attention to the actual content of academic disputes" (403). This point is underscored by Vargas's plausible point that philosophy (and other fields) are partly structured by norms "favoring such things as giving compelling evidence and saying true things" (408).

In conclusion, allow me a few comments about this volume as a whole. Many of the target articles in this volume do not aim to make stand-alone contributions to the literature. Instead, many summarize large bodies of work, and offer useful pointers to more substantive treatments in primary literature. Some articles -- in particular, those by Furlong and Santos and by Lee and Harris -- are noteworthy for bringing interesting new perspectives to a set of debates that many feel could use just that. And as I have already noted, some articles -- in particular, those by Nahmias and by Mele -- make substantive contributions in their own right.

It is not always easy for philosophers and scientists to understand one another, and this volume makes an important contribution to progress in that connection. For psychologists, philosophers and interested non-specialists, this volume offers accessible coverage of important recent work in the philosophy and moral psychology of action, and of nearby work in the social, behavioral, and neurosciences. In the volume's introduction Sinnott-Armstrong claims these chapters "represent the state of the art in bringing science together with philosophical views on free will and moral responsibility" (xvii). That is certainly right.

Mele, A. 2009. Effective Intentions: The Power of Conscious Will. Oxford University Press.

Levy, N. 2014. Consciousness and Moral Responsibility. Oxford University Press.

Shepherd, J. 2012. Free Will and Consciousness: Experimental Studies. Consciousness and Cognition 21(2): 915-927.