Moral Psychology with Nietzsche

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Brian Leiter, Moral Psychology with Nietzsche, Oxford University Press, 2019, 198pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199696505.

Reviewed by Matthew Meyer, The University of Scranton


Nietzsche's moral psychology is a hot topic. Paul Katsafanas' The Nietzschean Self (Oxford 2017) was followed by Mark Alfano's Nietzsche's Moral Psychology (Cambridge 2019) and this book by Brian Leiter. Like the other two volumes, Leiter's work brings together substantially revised versions of previous papers, so some of its contents will be familiar to scholars in the field. At the same time, the book gives us a fresh perspective on Leiter's interpretation of Nietzsche's moral psychology. Readers will now be able to see how the  papers Leiter published over the years fit together, and how he developed some of his ideas and responsed to his critics. Although I offer a handful of criticisms, I will say in advance that Leiter's book is a welcome contribution to the field of Nietzsche studies and moral psychology.

The book is divided into two parts: "Metaphysics and Epistemology of Value" and "Freedom, Agency, and the Will." Part I consists of four chapters that largely defend Nietzsche's anti-realism about value. Part II attributes to Nietzsche a fatalism that rejects notions of free will and moral responsibility -- thereby making Nietzsche a "hard incompatibilist" -- but also considers a conception of freedom at work in Nietzsche's text that is nevertheless both "deflationary and revisionist." The second part ends with a chapter, co-authored with Joshua Knobe, on Nietzsche's moral psychology that defends Nietzsche's views in contemporary terms and effectively functions as a coda to the book.

In the introduction, after laying out the terrain of moral psychology -- and there are differences between his understanding of moral psychology and Alfano's -- Leiter recaps his 2002 interpretation of Nietzsche as a naturalist and responds to criticisms that have emerged since. According to Leiter, Nietzsche is primarily a methodological naturalist, which means that there is a continuity between Nietzsche's philosophical claims and the methods of the successful sciences. Specifically, Nietzsche's methodological naturalism shares with the sciences the attempt to provide deterministic explanations of human phenomena with a few general principles. For Leiter, this means that Nietzsche appeals to psycho-physiological type-facts that constitute who a person is to explain the kind of moral beliefs one adopts.

Although many -- including myself -- have agreed with Leiter that Nietzsche is a naturalist of some sort, there is controversy surrounding the specifics of his account. For instance, Leiter claims that the kinds of explanations Nietzsche offers are speculative and therefore not necessarily confirmed by "existing scientific results." Instead, Nietzsche appeals to psychological mechanisms to "weave a narrative showing how these simple mechanisms could give rise to particular human beliefs and attitudes" (5). Fortunately for Nietzsche, these speculations, according to Leiter, have been largely confirmed by recent empirical investigations.

One puzzling feature of the naturalism Leiter attributes to Nietzsche is that it focuses so much on methods and only tangentially on using the results of the sciences to eliminate metaphysical explanations and transcendent metaphysical entities. It is puzzling because Schopenhauer was deeply worried about this sort of naturalism, and there are reasons for thinking that Nietzsche embraces the very kind of naturalism Schopenhauer rejects. For Schopenhauer, naturalism is the attempt to use the physical sciences to explain natural phenomena without any reference to metaphysical or transcendent entities, and so it can be understood as "a system of physics without metaphysics" (WWR II: 17). Although he points to atomists such as Leucippus, Democritus, and Epicurus as examples, Schopenhauer argues that more recent naturalists use science to reduce everything to force. As I have argued elsewhere, we find Nietzsche appealing to the results of the natural sciences to do just this (PPP, p. 60; HH 19; BGE 12), and so there are reasons for thinking that a dynamic ontology of force lies at the heart of his own naturalism.

Schopenhauer is deeply concerned about naturalism because he thinks it undermines the basis for morality. That is, Schopenhauer insists that metaphysics is a necessary condition for the possibility of morality (WWR II: 17), and this is why he refers to the naturalist as the "antichrist" (PP II 109). Indeed, Schopenhauer's critique of naturalism may provide the framework for explaining why Nietzsche holds the meta-ethical view that Leiter attributes to him in Part I, namely, that "there are no objective facts about values, including, most importantly, the values we associate with morality" (17). That is, Schopenhauer seems to think that transcendent metaphysics is a necessary condition for value realism, and an argument can be made that Nietzsche follows Schopenhauer in this respect. For instance, Nietzsche's attack on metaphysics in a work like Human could be understood as laying the foundations for an anti-realism about value that he expresses in works like Daybreak and The Gay Science.

Leiter, however, devotes his first chapter to offering a different explanation of Nietzsche's anti-realism about value. After showing that moral facts are not part of the best explanation for moral disagreement, Leiter claims that, for Nietzsche, anti-realism is the best way to explain moral disagreement or the fact that "after two thousand years, moral philosophers cannot agree on what we really ought to do!" (30). The chapter is full of argument and analysis, but the textual evidence for ascribing the latter view to Nietzsche is rather weak. Surprisingly, Leiter rests most of his case on a Nachlass note in which Nietzsche discusses how the sophists rejected the notion of a good in itself by providing dialectical justifications for a multiplicity of conflicting moralities (WP 428; KSA 13: 14[116]). Although Leiter tries to supplement his claim with passages from the published works (such as BGE 5), these passages tend to presuppose anti-realism rather than argue for it, and Leiter also has to deal with a published passage in which Nietzsche seems to reject this type of argument (GS 345). Of course, this does not mean that Nietzsche is not an anti-realist, and it is not to say that moral disagreement cannot be the basis for an anti-realism about value. It is, however, to say that there is only weak evidence for thinking that Nietzsche grounds his own anti-realism about value in this sort of argument.

Leiter's appeal to the Nachlass is surprising because he devotes significant space in chapter two to explaining why the Nachlass cannot be used as the sole source of evidence for Nietzsche's views regarding the will to power. Here, he is keen to discredit the status of what was made into the concluding section of The Will to Power in which Nietzsche states that the world is will to power and nothing else (WP 1067; KSA 11: 38[12]). Leiter does so by making two controversial moves. First, he restates an argument from his first book -- now in a more modest form -- that Nietzsche wanted to have at least some of the notes that were used for The Will to Power burned, "including its concluding section" (61). This story has a long lineage, and Leiter is relying on the work of Nietzsche biographers such as R.J. Hollingdale and Julian Young. However, a recent paper by Jing Huang has shown exactly which sections from The Will to Power Nietzsche left with his landlord, some of which were to be burned. As it turns out, the number of those sections is very small, and WP 1067 is not among those notes.

Leiter also bases his rejection of the will to power on the work of the "leading scholar of the Nachlass", Mazzino Montinari, claiming that Montinari has "conclusively discredited" WP 1067 by showing that Nietzsche had "discarded the passage by the Spring of 1887" (57). Montinari, however, does not say this. Instead, he simply says that Nietzsche eventually decided not to include what became WP 1067 in his own plans for The Will to Power. According to Montinari, Nietzsche did not include the note for WP 1067 in his final plans because he felt that BGE 36 -- the primary evidence from Nietzsche's published works for the view that the world is will to power -- had already expressed the basic idea of WP 1067 (2003: 89-90). From this, we can infer that Montinari thinks BGE 36 and WP 1067 should be read together. This, however, causes further problems for Leiter's position because he also relies on Maudemarie Clark's argument that BGE 36 is ironic, and Clark's argument depends on strictly separating the supposedly ironic BGE 36 from the unironic WP 1067. Thus, if we follow Montinari and read these passages together, we may be forced to acknowledge that the world, in Nietzsche's mirror, is will to power and nothing besides.

Such a conclusion, however, is precisely what Leiter wants to avoid. At stake is whether Nietzsche's call for a revaluation of values is itself grounded in a value that is epistemically privileged on objective or interpersonal grounds. Although Leiter devotes the last part of the chapter to responding to Phillipa Foot's claim that the revaluation appeals to our shared tendency to admire great individuals, the most interesting challenge to Leiter's interpretation comes from an objectivist reading that grounds the revaluation in the idea that power is objectively valuable. Here, Leiter breaks down the will to power into a descriptive thesis about agents wanting to maximize power and a prescriptive thesis which states that power is really valuable. Developing a point often used to criticize J.S. Mill, Leiter claims that the prescriptive thesis does not follow from the descriptive thesis. If this is right, and I think it is, then Leiter's anti-realism about value still holds even if Nietzsche interprets the world as will to power.

However, Leiter rejects both the prescriptive and descriptive theses, and he rejects not only the "crackpot" cosmological description of the world as will to power, but even the more modest psychological version in which persons are ultimately driven by power and so their actions can be explained in these terms. This is surprising because there are reasons for thinking that power is an essential element in Nietzsche's claim that "moralities are a sign-language of the affects," which is the leitmotif and title of Leiter's third chapter. Although Nietzsche undoubtedly appeals to both affects and drives to explain morality, a number of passages from Beyond Good and Evil (BGE 19, 23, and 36) suggest that power provides a deeper and more unified explanation of our drives and affects. This might be why Nietzsche opens the chapter of Beyond Good and Evil in which he introduces the idea that "moralities are a sign-language of the affects" (BGE 187) with the claim that the essence of the world is will to power (BGE 186).

In chapter three, Leiter avoids power and the will to power by turning away from Beyond Good and Evil and citing passages mostly from an earlier work that predates the introduction of the will to power, Daybreak. Appealing to these earlier texts, Leiter argues that, for Nietzsche, moral judgments are best explained "in terms of psychological facts about the judger" and that this view is consistent with the idea that "there are no mind-independent facts about value" (67). After delving into the roles that "feelings and affects" and "drives" play in forming moral judgments, Leiter concludes by arguing that the view he attributes to Nietzsche is also something contemporary philosophers should accept.

Chapter four ventures into epistemic questions that follow from the argument of the previous chapters and relate to Nietzsche's "doctrine" of perspectivism. At stake is whether Nietzsche's anti-realism about value also includes epistemic values. Because he claims that it does, Leiter must show why this does not undermine Nietzsche's commitment to methodological naturalism. He begins with a discussion of Nietzsche's perspectivism and develops his reading by focusing on two published passages in which the term and its cognates appear, GS 354 and GM III 12. Whereas GS 354 shows, according to Leiter, that knowledge is relative to "the human perspective, one we cannot escape in virtue of being human," GM III 12 advances the claim that all knowledge is dependent on affects (86). Leiter claims that "both passages presuppose the Busy World Hypothesis" (92), which holds that, because "there is so much we could know," what we cognize "depends on our affects and interests" (90). So construed, Nietzsche's perspectivism turns out to be "rather banal in the post-Quinean world" (99).

Although Leiter's incorporation of GS 354 into his account of Nietzsche's perspectivism marks an improvement over his 1994 account in which he focused almost exclusively on GM III 12, the scope of his account is still limited since it only mentions GS 374 in passing, largely refrains from employing the Nachlass to supplement his interpretation, and ignores the known source for Nietzsche's perspectivism, Gustav Teichmüller's The Real and Apparent World. If we add these to the mix, there is a strong case for thinking that the "busy world" of epistemic objects is -- just like value -- metaphysically constituted by a given perspective. This would conform to Nietzsche's anti-realism about things or objects expressed in passages like HH 19, WS 11, GS 110, BGE 12, GM I 13, TI "Reason" 5 -- as well as Nachlass passages in which Nietzsche explicitly associates consciousness and knowledge with the erroneous construction of persisting individuals (KSA 9: 11[162]) -- and correspond to Teichmüller's view that for something to be perspectival is for that thing to be a projection of the knowing subject. So construed, Nietzsche's perspectivism would be much less banal than Leiter wants to admit.

Leiter concludes Part I with a defense of Nietzsche's naturalism by addressing concerns that it is self-undermining, that it illegitimately extends its epistemic norms beyond its proper domain, and that it fails to explain normativity. Although variants of these challenges to naturalism can be found in or applied to Nietzsche's works -- most notably Nietzsche's insistence that in a de-deified world truth has no absolute value -- much of Leiter's discussion leaves behind Nietzsche's texts and defends naturalism on contemporary terms by engaging philosophers such as W.V.O. Quine, Ronald Dworkin, and T.M. Scanlon.

In Part II, Leiter turns to questions of agency, free will, moral responsibility, and determinism. Just as he mounts a powerful case for Nietzsche's anti-realism about value, he presents Nietzsche as a hard incompatibilist who rejects both alternate possibilities and control accounts of free will. He begins chapter five by casting Nietzsche as a fatalist who insists that we cannot be held morally responsible for our actions and ends by showing how this view undermines even compatibilist accounts of free will and moral responsibility.

The textual evidence Leiter cites in favor of Nietzsche's fatalism is significant, and it stretches from Human (1878) to Nietzsche's final writings. Although there are good reasons for thinking that Nietzsche's fatalism undermines traditional conceptions of free will and moral responsibility, there are questions about the specific sort of fatalism Leiter attributes to Nietzsche. Leiter appeals to what he calls Nietzsche's "Doctrine of Types": "Each person has a more-or-less fixed psycho-physical constitution, which defines him as a particular type of person" (3). Just as essential facts about a tomato plant determine that it will grow tomatoes rather than corn, there are "essential natural facts about a person" that will "significantly circumscribe," rather than "uniquely determine," the "possible trajectories" of one's life (122-23). Leiter also claims that this sort of fatalism differs from "Classical Fatalism," "in which all the details of one's life are determined in advance" (125). Instead, Nietzsche's fatalism is a "Causal Essentialism" in which "for any individual substance . . . that substance has some 'essential' properties that are causally primary with respect to the future history of that substance." Such Causal Essentialism, Leiter assures us, is clearly sufficient for undermining both alternate possibilities and control accounts of free will (125).

But there are worries here. First, it is not entirely clear that "Causal Essentialism" eliminates free will, and so I wish Leiter would have spelled out this claim in more detail. After all, I may be type-fact fated, qua human being, to never fly on my own power or live under the water, but there still seems to be room for me -- even given environmental factors -- to determine which possibilities I pursue within a range of trajectories, and thus it would also seem possible to hold me responsible for such determinations. Second, even if "Causal Essentialism" is sufficient to undermine free will, one still wonders if Nietzsche endorses the stronger claim that "all the details of one's life are determined in advance." This certainly seems to be the view he expresses when he compares human actions to a waterfall in which "everything here is necessary, every motion mathematically calculable" (HH 106), and some have claimed that the eternal recurrence entails that nothing in the world can be other than it is. Finally, given Nietzsche's continual interest in Greek tragedy, would it be that surprising if Nietzsche's fatalism expressed in "amor fati" (GS 275) turned out to be a version of "Classical Fatalism"?

Along these lines, it is interesting to note that T.K. Seung has read Zarathustra as an epic drama in which Zarathustra moves from embracing a conception of freedom and creativity that parallels the alternate possibilities free will that Leiter's Nietzsche rejects to accepting the cosmic necessity entailed by the eternal recurrence. I mention this because Seung explicitly connects this acceptance with Spinoza's idea that "true freedom lies in the union of human will and cosmic necessity" (2005: xviii). In addition, in chapter six, Leiter discusses Rutherford's case for attributing a Spinozian conception of freedom to Nietzsche. Here, Leiter acknowledges that Nietzsche often speaks of "freedom" and "free will" and even grants that Rutherford has a case for connecting Nietzsche's views to Spinoza's conception of freedom as autonomy. However, Leiter ultimately contends that Nietzsche has revised the notion of freedom so much -- hoping to capitalize on its "positive emotive valence and authority for his readers" (147) -- that it is hardly recognizable to either common sense or the philosophical tradition (161).

In the final chapter, Leiter and Knobe make the case that Nietzsche should be a key -- even the -- historical figure in contemporary moral psychology. They set out to show that "neglect of Nietzsche in moral psychology is no longer an option for those philosophers who accept that moral psychology should be grounded in real psychology" (by "real," they mean psychology based on "empirical findings") (162). Although many will resist the claim that Nietzsche is the historical figure in moral philosophy, Leiter and Knobe present a convincing argument for including Nietzsche alongside the likes of Aristotle and Kant in thinking about "how people actually come to perform moral (or immoral) behaviors" (166). According to them, Nietzsche holds that "type-facts," "fixed at birth," are largely responsible for determining a person's moral psychology, and this, they argue, is confirmed by recent empirical studies (167). This may indeed be the case, but one cannot help noticing the absence of power in the account of Nietzsche they present for consideration by contemporary audiences.

In the end, most of my criticisms are rooted in an approach to Nietzsche that emphasizes his sources and context, and places a premium on getting the historical Nietzsche right. In contrast, Leiter seems to be engaged in a "rational reconstruction" of Nietzsche's project, as he often invokes principles of charity (60, 61, 79) and elsewhere speaks of doing Nietzsche the philosopher a favor (2013: 594). Nevertheless, I sometimes worry that Leiter stretches the bounds of even this genre in his quest to present a Nietzsche that can be defended in contemporary terms, and so this book might be best understood -- as Leiter acknowledges at the end of the introduction -- as providing a Nietzschean approach to moral psychology (14). Either way, readers looking for a reading of Nietzsche that is rich in philosophical argument and places Nietzsche's moral psychology in conversation with contemporary Anglo-American philosophy will not be disappointed. I personally found Leiter's book to be a stimulating read that encourages us to resist moralizing interpretations of Nietzsche and opens up new avenues for situating Nietzsche in contemporary debates.


Huang, Jing (2019). "Did Nietzsche want his notes burned? Some reflections on the Nachlass problem." British Journal for the History of Philosophy 27(6): 1194-1214.

Leiter, Brian (1994). "Perspectivism in Nietzsche's Genealogy of Morals." In Nietzsche, Genealogy, Morality: Essays on Nietzsche's Genealogy of Morals, ed. R. Schacht, 334-352. University of California Press.

Leiter, Brian (2002). Nietzsche on Morality. London: Routledge.

Leiter, Brian (2013). "Nietzsche's Naturalism Reconsidered." In The Oxford Handbook of Nietzsche, eds. K. Gemes and J. Richardson, 576-598. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Meyer, Matthew (2014). Reading Nietzsche Through the Ancients: An Analysis of Becoming, Perspectivism, and the Principle of Non-Contradiction. Berlin: De Gruyter.

Montinari, Mazzino (2003). Reading Nietzsche, trans. G. Whitlock. Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press.

Seung, T. K. (2005). Nietzsche's Epic of the Soul: Thus Spoke Zarathustra. Lanham, MD: Lexington Books.