Moral Realism: A Defense

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Shafer-Landau, Russ, Moral Realism: A Defense, Oxford, 2003, 336pp, $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199259755.

Reviewed by Hallvard Lillehammer, King's College, Cambridge University


Analytical metaethics is an area where a great deal of ingenuity is currently required in order to find a distinctive yet plausible position to defend at any length. In this book, Russ Shafer-Landau demonstrates that the task remains possible. Over 300 pages or so, he defends an unorthodox combination of claims, including anti-Humeanism about reasons for action, mind-independent moral realism, moral non-naturalism, moral rationalism, and reliabilist moral epistemology. Shafer-Landau’s book will be useful to any student of philosophy who wants to gain a synoptic view of contemporary metaethics, and also to professionals with a stake in the many ongoing debates to which the book makes valuable contributions.

Shafer-Landau argues that the world contains mind-independent moral facts (Parts I-II). This claim gives rise to two well-known problems. The first is how moral facts are related to natural facts. The second is how mind-independent moral facts can be known. Shafer-Landau’s non-naturalist answer to the first question is less radical than it sounds. Naturalism is defined in terms of what the natural and social sciences investigate. Moral properties supervene on descriptive properties, among which Shafer-Landau includes all the natural properties of distant stars and so on, plus any supernatural descriptive properties there might be (p. 114-115). He treats the relation of supervenience as explanatorily primitive. There is a necessary coextension between the moral and descriptive properties that make up moral facts. Yet because moral properties are partly intensionally individuated, they are not identical to any set of the descriptive properties that constitute and variably realize them. Complete causal efficacy is carried by descriptive facts and properties. This leads to no problems of over-determination because although moral facts and properties enter into explanations, moral explanations are not fundamentally causal. In any case, the causal test of reality is unsound. While the details differ, the basic outlines of Shafer-Landau’s non-naturalism do not stray too far from contemporary naturalist orthodoxy, as exemplified by the work of Brink, Railton, Jackson, and others. The analogy with non-reductionist physicalism in the philosophy of mind is unmistakable, and is put to good use by Shafer-Landau in Part II of the book.

Shafer-Landau’s response to the second problem is more distinctive. We can know moral facts because some of them are self-evident, and we have reliable methods of discovering those that are not (Part V). This is reliabilism with a foundationalist twist. Verdictive moral judgments about cases, such as the wrongness of blowing up the earth tomorrow, are never self-evident, but we can know them non-inferentially by manifesting the epistemic virtue of applying generally reliable methods of moral thought. Such methods include the application of self-evident ceteris paribus principles, such as that it is wrong to take pleasure in another’s pain, to taunt and threaten the vulnerable, to prosecute and punish the innocent, or to sell another’s secrets purely for personal gain (p. 248). People may disagree about the soundness of self-evident principles, but this is no problem because self-evidence does not imply infallibility. There is room for reasonable disagreement about what guilt and innocence consist in, what property is, whether individuals have any rights to property, etc. There is also room for reasonable disagreement about the application of self-evident moral principles because principles do not logically entail verdictive judgments about cases. We might never be in a position to know that we have picked out the correct list of self-evident moral principles, made correct verdictive judgements about cases, or indeed that our moral thought is generally reliable. That’s the trick of reliabilism: no infinite regress or circularity of justification or inference, no need to know that you know, yet still all the first-order knowledge you need, right there at your fingertips.

According to Shafer-Landau, there is an intimate connection between moral knowledge so acquired and practical rationality. On his view, you are practically rational only to the extent that you are motivated in accordance with moral reasons. This is moral rationalism with a realist twist. According to Shafer-Landau, moral facts are ’intrinsically normative’, or necessarily reason giving, regardless of their relation to our beliefs, desires or other forms of response to the world (pp. 203ff). Unlike conventional and therefore only contingently reason-giving normative systems like etiquette, morality has what Shafer-Landau calls unlimited ’jurisdiction’ (p. 201). The content of morality is not ’conventionally fixed’ (p.202). This realist interpretation of moral rationalism is distinct from the rationalism of contemporary Kantians like Korsgaard and others, for whom the intrinsic normativity of morality derives from the structure of practical reasoning itself. According to Shafer-Landau, on the other hand, the intrinsic normativity of morality derives from the nature of a mind-independent normative reality. Shafer-Landau complements his realist rationalism with a distinctively non-Humean moral psychology, on which moral judgments express beliefs that motivate intrinsically, but not necessarily (Part III). When moral beliefs motivate, they do so without the help of independently given desires. Yet as the well-known case of the amoralist may illustrate, moral judgments can be disengaged from their normal affective companions in cases of lethargy, depression, indifference, and so on.

Shafer-Landau’s book contains many interesting arguments. Rather than picking out one such argument at random, I shall focus my critical remarks on the pros and cons of an argumentative strategy applied throughout the book, namely the defense of moral realism by means of what is sometimes called a ’companions-in-guilt’ strategy. My aim is thereby to locate morality as understood by Shafer-Landau with respect to other kinds of discourse about which the issue of realism arises, and thus to isolate one specific concern I have about Shafer-Landau’s position.

The basic thrust of companions-in-guilt arguments in ethics is the idea that if we reject objectivism about morality, then we are forced by parity of reasoning to reject objectivism about its target companions. But as the rejection of objectivism about the target companions is unacceptable, we should retain an objectivist view about morality as well. In spite of its frequent occurrence in the contemporary literature, the general prospects of the companions-in-guilt strategy for ethics remain poorly understood. The potential of the strategy clearly depends in part on the nature of the companions in question. Yet the nature of morality’s alleged companions is often itself controversial. It is therefore often unclear what is gained by linking morality to some alleged companion for the purposes of vindicating either its epistemological or metaphysical credentials.

Frequently cited companions in guilt for morality are epistemology, mathematics, the mind, and philosophy itself. Each of these is put to service by Shafer-Landau at some point in this book. Moral skeptics and antirealists are challenged by claiming that a) we have no more grounds to doubt the existence of reasons for action than we have to doubt the existence of reasons for belief and the inferential relations between them (p. 203; 236); b) intrinsically normative moral facts are no more mysterious than intrinsically normative mathematical facts (p. 206)); c) since folk-psychology is itself normatively loaded (desires are responses to reasons), a purely descriptive metaphysic entails eliminativism about the mind (pp. 33-37); d) ethics is in the same boat as contemporary analytical philosophy in its methodological conservatism and its failure to produce provably correct accounts of its subject matter (p. 220; 236; 264). These claims to companions are accompanied by further claims of analogy between morality and alleged companions. Thus, commonsense appeals to perceptual memory (p. 263) and the practical expertise of mathematicians, mechanics, and teachers of Latin (p. 298-9) are introduced to elucidate the reliabilism that allegedly explains how non-inferential moral knowledge is possible.

Perhaps the most interesting thing about these alleged companions in guilt is that none of them are obviously innocent. It is not as if no serious philosophical doubt has been voiced over the last century or so about epistemology, mathematics, folk-psychology, or indeed philosophy itself. This fact is cause for hesitation about the usefulness of appeals to companions in guilt, both in ethics and elsewhere. Nevertheless, some claims to companionship in guilt are more plausible than others. For example, folk-psychology arguably makes a better companion for the moral on Shafer-Landau’s non-naturalist terms than either the notoriously tricky domain of arithmetic or the less controversially causal domain of perception. Rather than tackling these large issues here, however, I shall focus my remarks on a domain that Shafer-Landau is keen to distance from morality, namely the domain of conventional normative systems like etiquette. I shall suggest that Shafer-Landau’s insistence on this distance creates a tension between his realist rationalism on the one hand and his non-naturalism on the other.

According to Shafer-Landau, moral facts are located at the non-conventional end of a conceptual map that has the natural facts about distant planets and so on at one end and the historically arbitrary conventions of etiquette on the other. Yet moral facts are not in the same ontological category as the natural facts about distant planets and so on. As we have seen, Shafer-Landau thinks that moral facts are non-natural. If so, there is an interesting disanalogy between morality and some paradigms of mind-independent fact. One plausible explanation for the non-natural character of morality is that it is partly definable in terms of our contingently given needs, interests, purposes and so on, whereas the character of the distant planets is not. After all, human beings have developed a variety of sophisticated moral systems throughout history precisely to address their contingently given needs, interests, purposes and so on. But then the non-natural character of morality argues for its place closer to the conventional end of the conceptual map than to the non-conventional end. I think Shafer-Landau would agree to this in the case of etiquette. The question is then why moral norms, with their analogous structure and history, should be so entirely different.

A parallel question is raised by Shafer-Landau’s claim that moral facts and the reliable procedures we use to track them are potentially unknowable. I think Shafer-Landau would agree that potential unknowability is easier to accept at the non-conventional end of the conceptual map than at the conventional end. Distant stars are good candidates for potential unknowability if anything is. Table manners are not. The idea of an unknowably correct way to order ones knives and forks is of dubious coherence at best. Yet according to Shafer-Landau, things are somehow completely different when we come to the norms of morality. I find this idea extremely puzzling. Perhaps one might just about be prepared to concede the coherence of unknowably correct moral norms if these were grounded in a Divine moral law, and our knowledge of this law were a matter of mysterious grace. Without a Divine Being to pick up the slack, however, the idea of necessarily reason-giving moral facts and their methods of discovery being unknowable sounds as plausible to me as the idea of undetectably correct table manners. Since I find it hard to take the latter idea seriously, I am drawn to the analogous view about morality. I therefore have to deny either Shafer-Landau’s realism or his non-naturalism, or both. Given the range of non-realist alternatives that remain on offer I incline towards the former option.

Is it a sign of maturity or decay when an area of philosophy reaches a stage where virtually every possible view, however implausible, is represented by a treatise-length study written in its defense? Do contemporary debates about modality, properties, causation, or the mind-body problem represent philosophy at its peak of maturity, or are these debates paradigm examples of a subject in decay? These are questions currently facing contemporary metaethics, the area to which Shafer-Landau’s book is among the most comprehensive, judicious, and well written to appear in recent years. Among the decreasing number of positions that remain undefended in this crowded area, Shafer-Landau has made a better attempt to defend his brand of realist rationalism than many would have thought possible. For those who still search for a fresh slice of metaethical terrain on which to stake their claim, the search continues. What about non-cognitivist moral realism? Too implausible even to contemplate? Not if you are prepared to seriously consider the unknowability of moral facts.