Moral Reality

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Bloomfield, Paul, Moral Reality, Oxford University Press, 2001, xvi + 208pp, $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 0-19-513713-2.

Reviewed by Peter Simpson, Graduate Center and the College of Staten Island, City University of New York


Moral realism has come very much back into favor among philosophers in recent years, despite the forces still pressing for some form of irrealism about moral values and prescriptions. Paul Bloomfield’s book is an instance of realism’s return to favor. He divides his exposition of this view into an ontological thesis: that moral goodness and badness are real properties of people and actions; an epistemological thesis: that our knowledge of morality is discovered and not invented; a linguistic thesis: that moral utterances are capable of truth and falsity; and a practical thesis: that we are not necessarily motivated to do what we know we ought to do. The chapters of his book take up each of these theses in turn and show how they are to be understood and defended. As such the book covers pretty much the ground that a book on this topic should cover.

So far so good. Problems, however, start immediately with Bloomfield’s introductory chapter or what he calls his Protrepticus. It is a cardinal rule of stating and defending a position in a well-worn debate (a debate that has gone on for about 100 years in analytic philosophy) that one understand the main positions in the debate and that one state one’s own position with full cognizance of the relevant alternatives. Bloomfield has, I’m afraid, done neither. In this he is not unlike a good many partisans of realism in ethics. The debate about such realism, or naturalism as it used to be called, reached a sort of apogee in the 50’s and 60’s when Hare was involved in a series of debates with Anscombe and Foot. Hare, of course, represented the nonnaturalist side and the two ladies the naturalist side (though they were joined by others, such as Warnock). Who won these debates was perhaps never finally decided, but Hare seemed to stay the course longer than the two ladies did. At all events their collective writings at the time covered just about most of the relevant questions and most of the relevant answers. Followers of either side were well advised to ponder these debates before venturing contributions of their own. Alas, this has not happened, or not happened enough. In particular it has not happened as regards Hare’s own arguments which, for reasons having little to do, as far as I can see, with philosophical merit, have received progressively less attention. Perhaps Hare’s prescriptivism is intrinsically not as attractive as realism, but anyone who wants to adopt realism needs to have some pretty good answers to Hare’s objections against it. Otherwise realism, at least in the world of analytic philosophy, will be so much uninformed posturing.

It is no good saying, for instance, as Bloomfield repeatedly does, that morality is like health and that some things just are good and bad for us as some things just are healthy or unhealthy for us. For one of the peculiar features about human speaking and acting is that we can commend as good and pursue as good absolutely anything we like, however healthy or unhealthy, or pleasant or unpleasant, or “good” or “bad” it may otherwise be. Of course it may be very foolish, even crazy, to commend and pursue some things, but that is not, and never was, the point. The point was simply a logical or linguistic one: the word “good” is so unfixed in its reference that one may, without logical or linguistic impropriety, call anything one likes good. If, to use one of Anscombe’s examples, I say a saucer of mud is good, I may be crazy but I am not abusing words or somehow offending the logic of “good”. That, at any rate, was always Hare’s claim and it is hard to see what is wrong with it taken precisely as such. Of course Hare went much further and built on this claim his whole anti-realist structure of universal prescriptivism, and here one might well demur. But it will not do simply to ignore that claim as if it didn’t exist and then embrace realism. One is at least obliged to give some alternative explanation of the claim. To her credit Foot wrestled with the issue, if not fully to her own or others’ satisfaction, but Bloomfield does not bother to wrestle at all. He fails to see that there is an issue (even when it is seemingly pushed in his face, p.18).

Well, maybe such logical puzzles as the universal predicability of good are not as important as Hare and others thought (Bloomfield would at least have the early Rawls on his side on this one). Anyway moral realism is an interesting position in its own right and deserves consideration just as such regardless of logical puzzles. Bloomfield’s version anyway has a special peculiarity: it is based on a capitulation to total skepticism. Moral reality, he says, is out there in the external world just like other facts clearly independent of us. Indeed moral reality is so much out there and so much independent of us and our thinking that we might be getting it totally wrong and, more to the point, we might be ignorant of our getting it totally wrong (we must not fool ourselves, he says, about our ability to fool ourselves). In other words Bloomfield’s moral reality might be so beyond our ken that it never comes within our ken. But a reality that never comes within our ken has a status no better than nothing at all and is best dismissed as an illusion or a verbal trick. Or, to put the point more directly, a distinction between reality and appearance, if it is to be a distinction at all, must not be drawn so tightly that reality never appears. For in that case there is no distinction left, but everything is reduced to appearance (a criticism that those familiar with the history of philosophy will recall Hegel using to devastating effect against Kant). Bloomfield’s moral reality turns out to be similar, or at any rate he is prepared to allow that it might be similar. In which case his reality is of no relevance at all, and above all of no relevance to morality, and we are of necessity left, if we want a morality, with making one up of our own. In other words Bloomfield’s moral realism leads directly to moral irrealism.

The above comments apply, admittedly, only to Bloomfield’s opening protreptic. However, I did not find anything in the rest of the book to dispel my initial disillusionment, and indeed, apart from a certain sophistication and familiarity with literature in the philosophy of biology as well as with the more recent literature in moral philosophy, I found nothing that added to the state of the moral reality debate as it was left by Hare, Foot, and Anscombe in the 60’s. As for the analogy between moral goodness and health, well that, as we all know, is as old as Plato’s Socrates, if not older. It is an excellent analogy, I agree. Plato also does an excellent job of getting Socrates and his interlocutors to take us through its subtleties.