Moral Reason

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Julia Markovits, Moral Reason, Oxford University Press, 2014, 208pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199567171.

Reviewed by Kyla Ebels-Duggan, Northwestern University


In this lucidly written monograph, Julia Markovits addresses two of the central questions of practical philosophy. First, what are reasons? More particularly, she asks whether or not our reasons for action depend on our prior motivations. Second, what reasons do we have? She is especially concerned with the question of whether all agents have moral reasons to act.

Markovits defends what may seem a surprising combination of answers. She argues that the best account of practical reasons construes them as dependent on the particular motivations of the agents that they govern. But, even so, we all have moral reasons to act, whatever our other motivations may be. The book falls neatly into two parts, arguing for each of these claims in turn.

Markovits places three of the most important contemporary theories of practical reason in dialog with one another. She positions herself in the tradition of Bernard Williams, and applies his label of internalism to her view about the nature of practical reasons. She tells us that

the essential feature of an internalist account is that it ties the truth of a reasons claim to the presence of a suitable element in an agent's motivational set: according to internalism, what we have reason to do depends fundamentally on what ends, broadly understood, we already have. Externalism, by contrast, holds that facts about our reasons do not fundamentally depend on what we care about. (51)

Elsewhere, she characterizes her view about what reasons are as proceduralist, and her ambition to vindicate the categorical authority of moral demands within this procedural conception has clear affinities with the constructivism of Christine Korsgaard. Finally, throughout the book, Markovits engages with Derek Parfit's externalist substantive realism about reasons.

Before looking to the details of Markovits' argument, it's worth wondering whether she can keep her two questions as distinct as she represents them as being. She presents her internalism as addressed only to the question about what reasons are, how to understand the nature of a reason, denying that it amounts to "a substantive normative claim about what we have reason to do" (8). But it isn't clear that internalism doesn't itself amount to a claim of this second kind, and a very controversial one at that. In response to the worry that the internalist and the externalist are speaking past each other, simply making use of different concepts of "reason," Markovits invokes T. M. Scanlon's characterization of the concept that they share: a reason is a "consideration counting in favor of" some action. But, if we take this as an account of what reasons are, then internalism apparently asserts that the only considerations that can count in favor of actions are those "appropriately grounded in the agent's prior motivations." That certainly looks like a substantive normative claim about what agents have reason to do. Construed as such it is at least as controversial as many of the substantive claims about reasons on which Markovits' externalist opponent relies. This is important because, as we will see below, our relative confidence in the normative commitments of internalists and externalists, respectively, plays an important role in both parts of Markovits' argument.

Let's turn to the argument now. After a first chapter introducing her topic, Markovits begins by rejecting what she identifies as a common line of support for internalism. The view that she rejects appeals to the motivating intuition, which holds that reasons claims must be capable of explaining actions, or -- what she takes to be the same thing -- the reasons an agent has must be capable of motivating him, or of being the reasons for which he acts. Markovits argues from counterexamples that the motivating intuition is false, and that we often find cases in which we cannot or ought not act for the reasons that we have.

Nevertheless, she claims, we ought to accept internalism on other grounds. This case, found in Chapter 3, is the core of the first half of the book. Markovits provides two main lines of support. First, she argues that it would be unduly hubristic or dogmatic to think my ends matter and others' ends do not or that I have special insight into what matters. The externalist is guilty of this sort of dogmatism when he responds to disagreement about what is worthwhile by asserting that his interlocutors are simply failing to appreciate the reasons that there are. The internalist, by contrast, takes reasons to be grounded in the motivations that people have, and thus begins from a presumption that everyone's ends are valuable. She revises this presumption only in cases where she can demonstrate that someone's endorsement of an end depends on a procedural error in reasoning. Since such procedural considerations are accessible to the person whose end the internalist rejects, this rejection does not amount to mere insistence.

This argument depends on procedural norms of reasoning being less controversial than the substantive normative claims on which the externalist relies. If they are not, then the internalist will not avoid the hubris of which she accuses the externalist by limiting herself to procedural claims. But one might think that the line between the controversial and the uncontroversial cuts across that between the substantive and the procedural. Markovits acknowledges that some substantive normative claims are not the least bit controversial. Her example is the claim that it's wrong -- that is, wrong for anyone -- to torture another just for fun. Insisting on this claim against those few who reject it doesn't seem to involve us in objectionable hubris or dogmatism. Markovits grants in passing that the externalist can account for "easy cases" like this. But she does not consider explicitly whether her internalist view treats them satisfactorily. Of course, if her argument purporting to vindicate moral reasons is successful, she can account for our judgments in these cases. But she is apparently committed to thinking that the warrant for our convictions about even these easy cases must wait on some proceduralist argument. Many may doubt that this is so.

Markovits' second line of support for internalism turns on a comparison between practical reasons and reasons for beliefs. She notes that some reasons for belief seem to be internalist or procedural. Insofar as my set of beliefs displays inconsistency and other sorts of formal problems, I have reason to revise it. Further, she claims, plausible external reasons for belief depend on features that have no parallel in the practical case. She suggests that this provides additional grounds for concluding that all practical reasons are internal reasons.

Markovits' explanation of what is special in the case of belief returns to the idea of the normatively uncontroversial. It seems, for example, that sensory experiences can provide externalist reasons to form new beliefs. But, Markovits argues, if they do, this is because sensory experience is an uncontroversial source of information about the world. By contrast, she claims, there is no uncontroversial way to form convictions about what is of value or what gives us reason to act.

But even if we accept that no single source of practical knowledge seems so reliable as sensory experience, it's not clear how this provides support for practical internalism. First, notice that we don't seem to have a general account of sources of externalist reasons for belief, and many think that these encompass more than just sensory experience. Markovits' original assertion of the disanalogy invokes an extremely restrictive foundationalist view in epistemology, one that would allow only for externalist reasons that yield beliefs somehow immune to error. But she should avoid staking her claim of a disanalogy on this highly contested position in epistemology. However, once we move to more permissive epistemic views it is less clear either that we can identify the sort of consensus about what sorts of considerations can figure as externalist reasons for belief, which Markovits finds lacking in the practical case, or that if we could, this would not have some practical analog.

Further, we might wonder what bearing uncertainty about an account of the proper methods for forming beliefs or adopting ends has on our entitlement to the beliefs or ends themselves. Even if "there's no consensus among philosophers on a reliable means of directly forming simple uncontroversial unlikely-to-be-mistaken aims and intentions" (64), there is widespread consensus about what at least some such aims and intentions are. Why should the externalist about practical reason condition his confidence in these convictions on the availability of a noncontroversial account of practical epistemology? Analogously, I don't seem to require a non-controversial account of the epistemology of testimony to be warranted in believing what people say.

In the second half of the book Markovits turns from the apparently conceptual question about what reasons are, to the substantive normative question, what reasons do we have? She purports to show that anyone who has any ends at all, anyone who thinks that anything matters, is committed to thinking that humanity matters. Since her internalism tightly constrains how she can argue for this conclusion, Markovits has set the bar for the success of her argument extremely high. She cannot presume the value of any substantive end, but must restrict herself to procedural practical norms that the skeptic presumably accepts. This argument should be of interest even to those unpersuaded by Markovits' internalism about reasons. It has the potential to address certain skeptical challenges to morality that the externalist cannot engage. It does so to the extent that it succeeds in arguing from premises that such skeptics accept to the conclusion that they should acknowledge the force of moral reasons.

Markovits argues as follows: You take your own ends to matter. But the most plausible grounding for, or explanation of, the value of your ends is your own value, the fact that you matter. She supports the second claim with two additional moves. First, an assertion that we should, on procedural grounds, prefer some single explanation of the value of our ends to accepting many value premises that are not systematically unified. And second, an argument from elimination of what she takes to be the best competitor for a single ground of value, happiness.

There's no implausible move here. But I'm not convinced that the argument meets the exacting standard Markovits adopts. One worry is that the skeptic might well deny the claim that unity in explanation is preferable, and especially the very strong view that we should expect some single ground of value. But the substantive, externalist, normative commitments in Markovits' argument also come to the fore in the details of her argument that happiness cannot serve as the master value.

Her case for rejecting the hedonic view appeals to the fact that many people value ends that cannot plausibly be reduced to happiness. She gives the example of a theoretical physicist who pursues knowledge at cost to his well-being. Markovits then appeals to a claim familiar from the first half: we ought to presume that everyone's ends are equally valuable, or that everyone is equally good at choosing ends. While this presumption is defeasible, we owe it to others unless we can show why it should be withdrawn. Since the view that ends matter because those who set ends matter vindicates this attractive presumption, while the competitor hedonic view requires us to reject the value of ends like the physicists', she concludes that anyone who has ends should acknowledge the value of humanity.

I am not at all confident that we should presume that everyone's ends matter equally, or that everyone is equally good at adopting worthwhile ends. But even those who endorse the presumption might doubt that this normative premise can figure in an interestingly internalist argument against the moral skeptic. Markovits might hold that it counts as a procedural claim because, like the instrumental norm, it doesn't assert the value of any particular end. But, if we understand procedural norms that way, it's not clear that they can play the role that Markovits assigns them. The restriction to procedural norms was motivated by the claim that they are less controversial than substantive value claims. Above I argued that some substantive value claims are non-controversial. If we allow that the presumption is procedural, it provides an example of a highly contestable procedural norm. It is arguably no less contestable than the moral principle that Markovits seeks to establish, and in fact seems uncomfortably close to the latter in content. It's not impossible that someone might grant the presumption that others' ends matter, while still doubting the authority of moral norms. Markovits' argument could plausibly move that character. But it seems that any moral skeptic worth his salt would resist the presumption. Then, absent some other argument, Markovits' internalism seems to commit her to withdrawing the claim that he has moral reasons.

I want to end by returning to the acknowledgement that the standard against which Markovits encourages us to measure her argument is tremendously ambitious. It amounts to nothing less than providing a convincing, substantive answer to the question, Why be moral?, providing the grounding for morality that many regard as the holy grail of moral philosophy. The book deserves thoughtful engagement, even if her overall argument does fall short of this mark. Markovits writes with extraordinary clarity and concision, ranges over fundamental issues about practical reason, moral psychology and moral philosophy, interacts thoughtfully with some of the best literature in these areas, and makes many compelling points, and more that deserve serious consideration, along the way. Contemporary moral philosophers need to wrestle with the relationships among the approaches she considers, and Markovits' own attempt to do so here makes her a valuable partner in this enterprise.