Moral Reasoning in a Pluralistic World

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Patricia Marino, Moral Reasoning in a Pluralistic World, McGill-Queen's University Press, 2015, 201pp., $27.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780773546158

Reviewed by Elizabeth Foreman, Missouri State University


Patricia Marino argues that moral coherence does not require the elimination of moral conflict, and that it does not require the systematization of principles that is called for in rich coherence models of justification. According to the central argument of the book, the case for rich coherence rests on the assumption that values are not plural; it is only if we assume that we do not value pluralistically that the systematization and unification of principles seems rationally required. Though there are many nested, intricate, and detailed arguments in this book, one of its main aims is to show that a rich coherence model is inappropriate if we value pluralistically. According to Marino, there is reason to think that we do value pluralistically, and the way in which we actually engage in ethical reasoning is more consistent with the idea that values are plural. Empirical research suggests that our having varying "value fields" makes the best sense of our reasoning and of widespread moral disagreement, and value pluralism sits well with the method that is common in applied ethics (reasoning back and forth between our convictions in particular cases and principles that explain those convictions). A rich coherence model, in other words, sits uneasily with how it is that we value, with the way in which we actually reason morally, and, ultimately, with the intractable moral disagreements we face in a pluralistic society.

Marino's other main aim is to argue for a different approach to coherence, what she calls "pluralist coherence." According to her, if we take value pluralism seriously and seek to bring our practice of moral reasoning in line with our theoretical understanding of it, we ought to endorse "case consistency" as the relevant norm for moral reasoning. Disagreement and diversity are not indications of errors in reasoning and do not pull against justification; according to the alternative model that Marino proposes, we should not be seeking principles that unify or systematize our moral convictions but should be trying instead to judge consistently between cases and prioritizing our values and their related principles in case-specific, rather than systematized, ways. That is, rather than ranking our values and principles and seeking a hierarchy or system to organize them, we should understand good moral reasoning as a function of prioritizing values and principles in specific contexts and attempting to be consistent in this across cases (i.e., not judging different cases differently for reasons that we cannot "stand behind" as marking morally relevant differences).

Marino thus offers an interesting and compelling alternative to a common way of approaching moral theory and justification. What is particularly compelling is that her arguments offer a way to reconcile the troubling disconnect between how applied ethics is often done and the way in which theory structures moral reasoning. Marino writes:

the methods that are considered most appropriate from a theoretical point of view are not the methods that are typically used in applied contexts. Here I argue, however, that the methods used in applied contexts -- of arguing for morally significant differences and similarities and drawing out implications -- are entirely appropriate from a theoretical point of view as well . . . If I am right about pluralist coherence, [the dominant theoretical] approach is mistaken: instead of considering which systematic or unified theory is most appropriate for a given problem, we ought to consider how to incorporate multiple values into an outlook that can be applied to all cases consistently. Multiplicity, pluralism, conflict, and compromise are not defects in a moral point of view.(pp. 8-9)

 Marino goes on to make a very compelling case for pluralist coherence over the course of six densely argued and rich chapters. The book has many virtues (clear, elegant, and thorough argumentation; deft engagement with an enormous literature; relevance to the practice of moral reasoning and the problems of moral disagreement that plague a pluralistic society), but it is especially refreshing to read a rigorous, sophisticated defense of the complex and messy business that actual moral reasoning turns out to be. The book is interesting, insightful, and engaging, and offers a compelling case for rethinking our approach to moral reasoning and the fact of moral disagreement.

There are many strands of argument in this book, so I will only be able to remark on a handful of the ideas running through it. It is difficult to excerpt individual issues from the very tight formulations of argument presented, but I will focus my remarks on two main issues: the problem of arbitrariness and Marino's response to it, and the related problem that plural coherence "must rest on, and cannot ground, a theory of what counts as moral value." (p. 105)

I am sympathetic with the motivation behind the argument for pluralist coherence and appreciate the insights that pluralist coherence offers for understanding and navigating moral disagreement. According to Marino,

If [the] explanation of disagreement in terms of pluralism is right, and of the pursuit of case consistency is an apt way of understanding what "reason" is in the moral domain, then what we would expect to find is that in these latter cases -- we might call them "value-based disagreements" -- interlocutors cannot agree, not because one or both of them is failing to use reason, or relying excessively on emotion or intuition, but because their disagreement transcends moral reason and instead tracks the person's value field. (p. 157)

However, though this feature of pluralist coherence might explain disagreement, it doesn't do much to help us when we encounter it. Marino argues that that is what we should expect -- that some disputes will be intractable because people have different values, or share them in different ways, or take some things to be morally significant that others do not. However, if the best we can do when we disagree is acknowledge that some things we take to be morally irrelevant in certain kinds of cases, others take to be morally relevant in those same cases (things like sex, race, or species), then whether one of us has arbitrary beliefs will really matter.

Marino addresses this problem when she makes the case for case consistency. She phrases the objection in this way,

A second possible objection claims that the account I've given of coherence as case consistency is toothless -- especially when it comes to morally significant differences -- because it allows anyone to justify anything he wants so long as he is willing to stand behind the differences in question . . . Forms of coherence that are based on case consistency don't help with this, because they give us no guidance on what is, and what isn't, a relevant or an arbitrary distinction. (p. 101)

Marino offers a three-part response to this objection. First, that any model of coherence in the context of conviction ethics will have to rest on assumptions about what is, or is not, a morally relevant difference; second, that systematized and rich coherence views suffer from this problem in a worse way; and third, that people involved in moral reasoning are required to make a case for morally relevant similarities or differences, so the problem of serious arbitrariness (marking the day of the week as a morally significant difference, for example) will rarely arise in practice.

However, even if it is true that any account of moral reasoning will suffer from some form of this kind of arbitrariness, it is less clear that other ways of understanding justification are in as great a danger as pluralist coherence with respect to the most extreme form of arbitrariness. Marino argues that what is required for case consistency is that one is consistent in how one reasons about various values, but that consistency ultimately involves being prepared to "stand behind" one's view of similarities and differences between cases. But if one is truly confident that a lie on Tuesday is different from a lie on Wednesday, and one is prepared to "stand behind" that, there is nothing anyone can appeal to in order to show her that this reasoning is arbitrary. In the case of a more systematized view, the claim that it is morally relevant that a lie was told on Tuesday rather than Wednesday would probably not fit well with one's other commitments, even if the claim was consistently appealed it to a narrow range of cases. But in the case of pluralist coherence, one can't say that this claim doesn't fit unless it isn't consistently appealed to. So long as it's consistently appealed to, it seems as if a pluralist coherentist must accept it as a legitimate part of one's moral point of view.

For more standard cases, Marino argues that a systematized view and the pluralist coherence view both rest on assumptions about morally relevant similarities or differences but the systematized view will be in a worse position than pluralist coherence when it does so because it will have to rely on a single standard of relevance. According to Marino, our everyday moral practice indicates that we are more pluralist than this in our convictions and commitments, so the rich coherentist's assumptions are worse than those made by the pluralist coherentist in virtue of their failure to capture the fact that we value in a pluralist way.

However, the assumptions might function differently; it is true that if I am a preference-utilitarian, I assume that species is morally irrelevant to questions of moral status and that what is morally relevant in any case is that one has preferences. This is an assumption that, if not shared by one's interlocutor, will surely stymie debate; however, the person who holds it isn't committed to saying anything like, "Being human doesn't matter morally at all." What she can do is explain how being human is, and is not, related to that morally relevant criterion. Far from over-simplifying our moral lives, the "single standard" is meant to help us see why what seems morally relevant actually is relevant and to see when things we think are morally relevant actually aren't. I'm not yet convinced that this exercise is worse than one in which one admits that preferences matter and so everything that has preferences matters morally, but that one is also sure that being human matters morally on its own in a way that being a cat does not, so one just has to prioritize those competing values in some way. It may be that some theories are overly simple, but that seems to be a problem with the theories themselves, and not evidence that we need to jettison the whole practice of systematization.

I am drawing here on Marino's understanding of what case consistency involves, and of how prioritization works within it. According to her,

An essentially inconsistent set of principles might require that we provide equal resources for all children, and also that we provide more resources for our own children than for others. As odd as such a set of requirements might seem in other ways, there is nothing standing in the way of prioritizing among these concerns, and either might be most important. Such prioritization does not require eliminating the conflict. And thus nothing about prioritization per se requires us to prefer principles that are essentially consistent. (p. 33)

This discussion comes in the context of explaining why neither practical nor essential consistency need be criteria for good moral reasoning, since dilemma cases are real. According to Marino, the existence of conflicts between principles doesn't require eliminating the conflict; it only requires figuring out a way to navigate it. Her claim is that these kinds of conflict can exist in a coherent moral view so long as the person who endorses both principles is able to prioritize them consistently (where prioritization doesn't imply systematization or reduction). But it's hard to understand what it would mean to prioritize two principles that require opposite commitments in the way the two in the above quote do. It's easier to understand how a commitment to honesty and to promise-keeping might conflict in particular situations (practical inconsistency) -- to take Marino's example, conflict is easier to understand in the case in which one is asked by a trusting relative if one knows information about which one has promised to keep silent. There is conflict because it is impossible to honor both commitments in this case, so one simply has to prioritize. But the "single standard" that she rejects seems helpful for trying to understand why one prioritizes in the way one does in this case (thus making one's choices less arbitrary) and seems better able to do this than a method according to which all one can say in defense of one's convictions regarding prioritization is that one "stands behind" them. Since Marino doesn't claim that plural coherence requires having no general or organizing principles at all, or no weighted convictions, I am not sure that the benefit of having brute values that one just appeals to in hard cases (i.e., the benefit of fitting our value pluralism better) outweighs the benefit of having a unified answer to why one settles those disputes the way one does.

This brings me to the other concern mentioned above: that the starting point of such an account contributes to the problem of arbitrariness. Marino is right that ethics is messy, that theory is often disappointing in making sense of that mess, and that justification often seems like a groundless practice. I understand the desire to face one's assumptions head on, to try not to argue them out of sight, but to insist instead that we take values as a starting point. Where else would we start? However, in leaving these starting points as "givens" in the way Marino suggests, the result is that all we can really do when we disagree is try to ferret out case inconsistency; if the committed racist is case consistent, there's nothing we can say to her. In cases where we share values and just prioritize them differently, this seems like a good (even enlightened) approach -- if I think you should lie to protect a friend and you don't, it can make good sense to say that neither one of us has made a mistake in moral reasoning. But in the case of a lack of shared values, in a case of radical disagreement about what matters morally, it would be good to be able to show someone that there is something wrong with those values -- usually, that they are not consistent with other things she believes. But that seems harder to do if we endorse Marino's account, since the committed racist is entitled to have conflicting values so long as she is consistent in her prioritization of the values and principles she endorses.