Moral Repair: Reconstructing Moral Relations after Wrongdoing

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Margaret Urban Walker, Moral Repair: Reconstructing Moral Relations after Wrongdoing, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 250pp., $27.99 (pbk), ISBN 0521009251.

Reviewed by Brad Wilburn, Chadron State College


In Moral Repair, Margaret Urban Walker examines recovery from wrongdoing.  Wrongdoing can run the gamut from familiar personal betrayals and shortcomings to the most egregious forms of human evil, such as genocide and longstanding oppression. Walker's account of moral repair is aimed at the broad range of wrongdoing.  Given human fallibility, Walker claims that repairing the damage from wrongdoing is "an unavoidable human task." (p. 6)  Walker's project, as she describes it, "is to expose the conditions of moral relationship that are a reference point for assessing whether an intended repair of moral relationship achieves its aim." (p. 10) In her introductory chapter, she provides an initial description of moral repair that brings out what these conditions are:  "moral repair is restoring or creating trust and hope in a shared sense of value and responsibility." (p. 28)  Over the next two chapters, she discusses both hope (Chapter 2) and trust (Chapter 3) in more detail.  Once wrongdoing occurs, hope and trust are battered, and a typical response is resentment.  Walker engages in a discussion of resentment in Chapter 4.  In the final two chapters, Walker discusses forgiveness (Chapter 5) and making amends (Chapter 6) as attempts to undo the damage from wrongdoing in order to recapture (or capture for the first time) the lost hope and trust.

Walker presents a compelling picture of the interconnections between hope and trust and moral relations.  "While our moral understandings are grounded on trust," she writes, "this trust is in turn dependent on hope." (p. 44)  Walker describes different elements of hope:  its focus on the future, the desire involved in it, the belief in the possibility of achieving the thing desired, and what she calls the efficacy of hope, which refers to the ways in which hope spurs further thought and activity.  Indeed, claims Walker, hope is "an individual and social necessity," (p. 42) in that it underlies the sort of aspirational activity that gives life meaning.  One way in which wrongdoing, especially egregious wrongdoing, diminishes lives is by crushing hope.  The next step is to connect hope to trust.  We sometimes use trust to refer to inanimate objects -- for instance when we say that we trust the bridge we are walking across -- but interpersonal trust, according to Walker, involves an additional component.  It involves attributing certain kinds of motivation to the other person.  Because of this, interpersonal trust goes beyond mere prediction and connects with responsibility:  "Trust links reliance with responsibility." (p. 80)  That is, interpersonal trust involves not just a predictive expectation that something will happen, but a normative expectation that other people will behave as they should.  These normative expectations forge the link between hope and trust.  "Normative expectations can be trusting when they embody a hopeful attitude," writes Walker. (p. 69)  Walker's positions on hope and trust have implications for moral repair.  Given the crucial role played by hope, "morally reparative measures must often aim at restoring or igniting hope." (44)  Given the normative element of trust, recapturing lost trust will require a reaffirmation of the violated norms.

Normative expectations come into play in Walker's discussion of resentment as well.  She disagrees with Jean Hampton's account of resentment.  According to Hampton, a major feature of being mistreated is that it sends a message about one's standing:  one is not worthy of better treatment.  Resentment is a defense against this attack on one's self-esteem.  Walker does not deny that resentment can involve threats to one's self-esteem, but she characterizes resentment more broadly:  "resentment responds to threats to expectations based on norms." (p. 114)  Beyond just reacting to this threat to norms, however, Walker insists that resentment invites a response as well, and the response being called for is to have the norms that have been violated reaffirmed.

Having described the hope and trust that wrongdoing often undermines, as well as the resentment that it often engenders, Walker finishes the book by describing two ways of engaging in moral repair, one a project that a victim will sometimes take on and the other a project that the wrongdoer will sometimes take on:  forgiveness and making amends.  A major advantage of Walker's discussion of forgiveness is that she insists that "Forgiveness is a variable human process and a practice with distinctive versions." (p. 152)  Thus, she is skeptical of accounts of forgiveness that attempt to pin down what forgiveness "really" is.  She identifies in the literature on forgiveness three different features that are claimed by different writers to be definitive of forgiveness.  Her position is that while each of these is a facet of forgiveness, none is absolutely necessary for forgiveness.  First, forgiveness is often defined as forswearing resentment.  Walker agrees that getting past resentment is often part of forgiveness, but she argues that people can be said to have genuinely forgiven even if many negative emotions linger.  Second, some define forgiveness as the restoration of the relationship.  Once again, this is often involved in forgiveness, but it need not be.  One swamped by bitterness can forgive as a way of shedding this bitterness, even though the prospects for a relationship with the wrongdoer have been eliminated by death or distance.  The third approach is that "forgiving fixes a wrong in the past as wrong, while releasing the future from its impact." (p. 169)  The caution that Walker issues here is that the exact nature of the wrong is not always fixed precisely.  Things can be left indeterminate, contrasting interpretations can sometimes coexist, precise motivations may not be known and may not need to be known, and understanding of these matters can grow and shift over time.  Still, the wrongdoer and the victim can make progress on restoring the relationship even given this indeterminacy.  All in all, these three features are crucial for understanding forgiveness, but we should be wary about insisting that any of them is necessary.

Walker describes "amends" as "intentionally reparative action by parties who acknowledge responsibility for wrong, and whose reparative actions are intended to redress that wrong." (p. 191)  In her discussion of making amends, she points to "the sheer ordinariness of the occasions and assumptions of our familiar repertory of reparative gestures" (p. 192) to help us think about the challenges involved in making amends for more egregious forms of wrongdoing.  In the ordinary cases, the standard apologies and excuses and tokens by which we give an accounting and make it up to the people we wrong can do their work because they rely on a reservoir of trust and hope, she argues.  With egregious wrongdoing, this reservoir has been drained dry, and our familiar strategies of making amends come under extreme stress.  This gap between our ordinary practices and these extreme situations serves as the backdrop for Walker's discussion of restorative justice, an approach to justice that puts making amends to the victim and restoring moral relationships central, as opposed to both retributive justice, which focuses on how the wrongdoer should be treated, and to compensatory justice, which looks to making up for the past more than to a restored relationship in the future.

I would like to close by pointing to one strength of Walker's discussion and one crucial consideration that seems to me to be underemphasized.  One strength is the important theme of community that wends through Walker's discussion.  The process of moral repair, as Walker describes it, is not simply a dyadic process between wrongdoer and victim.  Wrongdoing takes place in a social context.  It violates social norms.  Thus, the community in which it occurs can be both partially responsible (for letting the violation take place) and partially victimized (insofar as its norms are being threatened).  This theme first gets sounded in the introductory chapter when she claims, "Wrongdoers and victims -- whether individuals or groups -- are a natural focus for moral repair.  It is less obvious but essential to see that moral repair is always at the same time a communal responsibility." (p. 29)

This theme recurs throughout the book.  For instance, part of Walker's discussion of trust is the notion of default trust:  the level of security that is typically a background assumption, based on the institutions and standard practices of one's community.  In her discussion of resentment she claims that resentment invites a response, a reassurance of norms.  This invitation is certainly addressed to the wrongdoer, but it is partly to one's normative community.  It is a call for that community to enforce the norms on which its members rely.  Another example comes in her discussion of restorative justice.  In discussing South Africa's Truth and Reconciliation Commission, she points out how the mere ability to tell one's story and have it accepted as part of the public record has a restorative effect.

While Walker talks often about restoring relationships and reaffirming norms, she does not explicitly discuss one aspect of the situation which, it might be argued, is most in need of repair:  the character of the wrongdoer.  She does present herself as wanting to focus on the victim, (p. 6) and it is perhaps a legitimate criticism of our social responses to wrongdoing that we pay too much attention to what we are going to do to the wrongdoer than what we are going to do for the victim.  When we think about criminal wrongdoing and the atrocities that call out for moral repair in the political realm, it may be that hoping for much improvement in the character of wrongdoers is misplaced hope.  Even so, it is important to think about moral improvement in the context of moral repair.  First of all, though I agree that we should focus on the victim, some of what the victim would benefit from are things from the wrongdoer:  recognition of wrongdoing; regret and repentance; and a commitment to becoming the sort of person who will not repeat the same wrong.  Walker does acknowledge that although she will focus on victims, "wrongdoers will also be central." (p. 7)  Walker is right that we should focus on the victim, but one of the most crucial ways in which this needs to be done is for wrongdoers to improve the aspects of their character that have led them to not focus adequately on the people they ended up victimizing.  Secondly, though our attention is captured when wrongdoing is egregious, and though we may have less reason to hope that the wrongdoers in these cases will improve morally, less severe, but more common, wrongdoing also occurs in all our lives.  Though not as devastating as extreme wrongdoing, this more common form still damages relationships, saps hope, and whittles away at trust.  With this form of wrongdoing, we are alternately perpetrators and victims.  Here, we do hold out hope that we can improve.  Thus, part of what contributes to restoring relationships and reaffirming norms is our willingness to try to improve ourselves.

There are various areas of Walker's discussion where I believe this point is applicable.  For instance, one of the six tasks that Walker claims are encompassed in moral repair is the task of acknowledging and addressing wrong. (p. 28)  Acknowledging one's wrongdoing is best seen, however, as the mere first step in a project of trying to become the sort of person who would no longer make that sort of mistake.  The acknowledgment of a mistake is of little comfort if the person in error is likely to keep making the mistake.  Additionally, this point gets deepened when we consider Walker's discussion of the importance of trust.  One of the conditions that Walker points to if trust is to be restored after wrongdoing is that "the wrongdoer is truly repentant and reassurance." (p. 90)  This is right, but it is important to insist that true repentance involves a commitment to improve oneself and such a commitment would contribute greatly to the genuine reassurance of the victim.  This same point comes up when we consider forgiveness.  Forgiveness is often a response to repentance, to apology.  Walker's general approach to forgiveness is right, it seems to me, and so we should be cautious about insisting that an apology is a necessary precondition for forgiveness.  It is, I would argue, present in the best-case scenario of forgiveness, however.  A sincere apology includes a commitment to improve, and a victim's ability to follow through on the process of forgiveness is fueled by ongoing signs of improvement in the wrongdoer.  Finally, repairing one's character as a wrongdoer cannot replace the demand to make amends, but doing so can replenish the reservoirs of hope and trust that make amends more effective.

All in all, Walker provides a discussion of an important but relatively neglected topic, and it is a discussion that is both full of rich details and insights and built around an overarching structure that helps us make sense of this richness.