Moral Responsibility and the Problem of Many Hands

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Ibo van de Poel, Lambèr Royakkers, and Sjoerd D. Zwart, Moral Responsibility and the Problem of Many Hands, Routledge, 2015, 226pp., $145.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138838550.

Reviewed by Diane Jeske, University of Iowa


The problem of how to assign moral responsibility when large groups of people, organized or unorganized, wrongfully cause some harm is pervasive in our world given the ubiquitous nature of large organizations such as corporations, nations, universities, etc. Ibo van de Poel, Lambèr Royakkers, Sjoerd D. Zwart, and their fellow authors, characterize the problem of many hands (PMH) as "the occurrence of the situation in which the collective can reasonably be held morally responsible for an outcome, whereas none of the individuals can reasonably be held morally responsible for that outcome" (5). Their aim is to develop a conceptual framework for moral responsibility in cases where the PMH arises that facilitates the formulation and implementation of solutions to the PMH (7). The focus of the book, then, is not on, for example, ontological worries about the relationship between individuals and collectives, but rather on the practical issue of how to avoid having no one other than the collective as a whole to hold responsible for some wrongful harm.

The book has three authors but is, in reality, a collaboration between six persons: Chapter 3 has Tiago De Lima as co-author, Chapter 5 is attributed to Neelke Doorn, while Chapter 6 is attributed to Jessica Nihlén Fahlquist. The book is not, however, an anthology -- it is clear that all of the authors are working within the same framework and aiming to produce a single unified text. Therefore, in the rest of the review, I will not distinguish between the various authors but will simply refer to van de Poel et al. as the author of the work.

The book can be seen as breaking into roughly two parts, with Chapters 1-3 offering a conceptual framework for moral responsibility in cases where the PMH arises, and Chapters 4-6 offering suggestions for avoiding the PMH. Chapter 1 offers a conceptual analysis of moral responsibility, distinguishing between five normative meanings of responsibility, two of which -- responsibility-as-virtue and responsibility-as-obligation -- are forward-looking, while the other three -- responsibility-as-accountability, responsibility-as-blameworthiness, and responsibility-as-liability -- are backward-looking. To say that an agent is forward-looking responsible-as-obligation for some state of affairs is to imply that that agent ought to see to it that that state of affairs obtains (27).  Van de Poel et al. claim that there are "three routes for acquiring forward-looking responsibility-as-obligation based on three main ethical theories: consequentialism, deontology, and virtue ethics" (31). It is unclear precisely what the authors have in mind in discussing these three 'routes.' For example, they say that consequentialism does not tell us which agent or agents are responsible for bringing about some desirable state of affairs, and so it needs "to be supplemented by a theory, principle, or reasons for distributing responsibility in order to establish forward-looking responsibility-as-obligation" (31). According to van de Poel et al., the consequentialist could choose to do so on consequentialist grounds -- attributing responsibility to the agent in the best position to bring about the relevant state of affairs -- or the consequentialist could adopt a non-consequentialist principle for the distribution of responsibility-as-obligation.

But a consequentialist cannot remain a consequentialist and adopt a non-consequentialist principle unless that latter principle were adopted as a rule-of-thumb such that people following the rule will, in the long run, have better consequences than if they did not follow the rule. Then, however, while the rule-of-thumb may appear non-consequentialist, its justification is in consequentialist terms. Also, it is simply false that a consequentialist will say that an agent S ought to see to it that a state of affairs Y will be brought about if and only if S is in a better position than any other agent to see to it that Y is brought about. After all, perhaps S is in such a position, but in bringing about Y, S would thereby fail to bring about X, where her bringing about X would, on balance, have greater net value than would her bringing about Y. The reason why I am belaboring what may appear to be a small point is that the presentation of the 'consequentialist route' here is not true to a consequentialist moral theory and so makes the reader wonder what the precise nature of the project is. Perhaps, for example, the authors are trying to offer different principles that people in organizations might adopt for distributing responsibility-as-obligation and so are working at a practical level without really being concerned about higher-level issues in moral theory. If this is so, then the discussion is at the very least misleading.

In Chapter 2 van de Poel et al. offer five characterizations of the PMH, one corresponding to each of the five types of moral responsibility discussed in the previous chapter. They distinguish between three types of collectives and discuss both the conditions under which responsibility can legitimately be attributed to collectives and the relationship between individual and collective responsibility. They then provide two examples, including climate change, in which they try to disentangle attributions of responsibility. In their discussion of the different types of collectives, they seem to want to distance themselves from any ontologically suspect notions of collective intentionality, and so talk about collective aims rather than collective intentions: "A collective aim is an aim in the minds of individuals, but its content may be irreducibly collective in the sense that it refers to things that can only be collectively achieved and not by the individuals in isolation" (56). It would have been helpful here to have more discussion of what the authors mean by saying that the 'content may be irreducibly collective,' because such a claim can be understood in a trivial way or in a much more robust way. Without more discussion of the senses in which we can and cannot reduce collectives to the individuals who are in the collective, it is difficult to understand what the authors have in mind.

Chapter 3 provides a formalization of the concepts and claims in Chapters 1 and 2. Not surprisingly, then, the chapter is highly technical and will only be accessible and of interest to those who are concerned with deontic logics. Fortunately, those who do not have the requisite interest or background can easily skip this chapter without losing the main thread of the book. However, in so jumping ahead, they will find themselves in Chapter 4, which discusses the issue of distributing responsibility within occasional collections of agents, which were defined in Chapter 2 as groups that "lack a collective aim but that nevertheless can be reasonably expected to form a collective in one of the two above senses [i.e. can be expected to form either an organized group or a collective involved in joint action] to avoid harm or to do good" (56). The difficulty with this chapter is that the authors take as their case study a manure processing facility in the Netherlands, charting the different roles played by, for example, various agricultural organizations, the Ministry of Agriculture, individual farmers, the European Community, etc. Readers who do not take a particular interest in this sort of political/agricultural issue will have a difficult time following the ins and outs of the maneuvering involved and will also most likely not be much motivated to devote time to sorting them out. A livelier issue with greater resonance would have made this discussion appealing to more than a quite narrow readership.

Chapters 5 and 6 address issues about how to avoid PMH's. In Chapter 5 the authors appeal to Rawlsian notions of overlapping consensus and reflective equilibrium. The upshot of the discussion seems to be that involving people in developing procedures for distributing responsibility will facilitate reflection both on first-order judgments and on higher-level moral theories. This reflection, then, will allow for agreement to be reached about what is to count as a fair distribution of responsibilities. In Chapter 6 the authors are concerned about how to create institutional environments that promote responsibility-as-virtue: "i is responsible-as-virtue implies that i voluntarily assumes various responsibilities-as-obligations in the light of [the] plurality of normative demands and does so with judgment" (30). Responsibility-as-virtue, they claim, requires care, moral imagination, and practical wisdom, so education in the professions needs to select for and develop these sorts of capacities rather than just technical capability. These two chapters, 5 and 6, raise more questions about the nature of the project because they do not attempt to provide solutions from the perspective of one of the moral theories discussed as 'routes' to responsibility attribution in Chapter 2. With respect to Chapter 5, the problem is a familiar one: why should people with different moral theories -- consequentialist, deontological, or virtue ethical -- expect to come to an agreement on some first-order question of responsibility attribution? Why should we expect to agree on what is to count as fair if we disagree even with respect to what it is to call a distribution fair? As I say, these are problems familiar to anyone who has considered Rawls's notion of an overlapping consensus -- the overlap may, in fact, be empty, or at least devoid of an answer to the particular question that we are considering.

This book will, I think, be of use in its entirety to those who are concerned with practical issues of responsibility distribution in institutions, particularly institutions of a fairly technical nature. Individual chapters are more likely to have a wider interest. Chapter 2 does a nice job of outlining the various notions of moral responsibility, with supplemental summary tables. Chapter 5 will be of interest to those concerned to extend Rawls's notion of overlapping consensus beyond the political context, and Chapter 6 to those interested in applying the notion of a virtue within an organizational context. Reading the introduction can guide the reader to those parts of the book that may be of interest and help to avoid getting bogged down in formalization and case studies that may distract one from those issues of interest.